Knowledge and Virtue in Early Stoicism

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Håvard Løkke, Knowledge and Virtue in Early Stoicism, Springer, 2015, 134pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789400721524.

Reviewed by Nathan Powers, State University of New York at Albany


The Stoics thought it possible for a human to live free from error, that is, with fully warranted confidence in all of your beliefs (including those beliefs that serve as your motives for action). This is not the normal condition of humans, of course. But according to the Stoics it is in an important sense the natural human condition. Our natural tendencies are such that if they develop without hindrance or perversion -- a big if -- we will come to live like that: as wise persons or sages. In this brief and rather idiosyncratic monograph, Håvard Løkke attempts to reconstruct the epistemological theory that underwrote the early Stoics' picture of life without error as the attainable human ideal.

Crucial to this picture is the Stoic doctrine of the cognitive impression. Since we humans are sentient beings, our souls are affected by the world around us so that we have various impressions of the way things are. And since we are rational beings, our impressions have propositional content: it typically appears to us that such-and-such is the case. In any particular instance, if we give assent to an impression (that is, to its content), a belief or an action ensues. Or to put it the other way around, the Stoics think that our beliefs and actions flow directly from the descriptions of the world around us (and of our situation) that we accept. Wisdom is possible on the Stoic view because some of our impressions -- indeed very many of them -- carry their own epistemic warrant with them. That is, some impressions represent the world to us in a way that they could not if they were not accurate representations of how things are; and so we are always justified in giving assent to them. These are the "cognitive" impressions, and they serve as the criteria of truth. A wise person generally refrains from giving assent to non-cognitive impressions, and so does not form beliefs (or act) on the basis of false impressions.

The Academic Sceptics vigorously objected to the claim that there exist cognitive impressions. Most famously, they asked how you can ever tell whether you are having such an impression: for any putatively cognitive impression, could there not exist a qualitatively identical impression that is in fact not cognitive? (In pressing this objection they appeal to the impressions of dreamers and madmen, cases that are familiar to modern epistemology from Descartes.) One of the achievements of scholarship in ancient philosophy over the past 40 years has been the ongoing reconstruction of the cut-and-thrust of the debate between Stoics and Academics on this subject: we now see that it was a high point of ancient epistemology, and indeed of ancient philosophy in general.

However, the early Stoics evidently did not intend their doctrine of the cognitive impression to secure the possibility of wisdom against possible sceptical objections. What the doctrine's original justification and role was within the Stoic system is a good question that has to some extent been obscured by scholarly attention to the fierce debate that it provoked. This is the overarching question that Løkke takes up.

Løkke's approach to the question is shaped by a view that he reveals explicitly only in the book's final pages (Chapter 6, p. 123). He thinks that much of the evidence in Cicero and Sextus Empiricus that is usually taken to pertain to disputes over the cognitive impression between the early Stoics and the Academic Sceptics in the 3rd c. BC in fact describes a later controversy (starting in the 2nd c. BC) between the Academic Carneades and the successors of Chrysippus (the prolific and influential third head of the Stoa). In other words, the entire debate, on Løkke's account, got going (or at least heated up) later than scholars have usually taken it to. This in turn leads Løkke to think that not only the Stoic founder Zeno but also Chrysippus developed the school's epistemological views without feeling constrained by a pressing need to respond to sceptical criticism. Scholars interested in the history of ancient scepticism will find this chapter, which also makes a number of other intriguing suggestions about the Stoic-Academic debate, interesting on its own. Whether or not its claims are found convincing, the question of the original role and justification for the doctrine of the cognitive impression remains a good one.

The book's earlier chapters set the stage for the discussion of this question: after a historical introduction in Chapter 1, Chapters 2 and 3 discuss some relevant aspects of Stoic metaphysics and logic (respectively). But Løkke's answer to the question is contained mainly in Chapter 4, his reconstruction of Chrysippus' epistemological theory. He attributes to Chrysippus a straightforwardly externalist view about cognitive sense-impressions: they are reliable because they are caused in us in the right way. That is, their features are caused by the relevant features of the objects that they disclose to our awareness, and because of this we can trust their accuracy. (The further question of what, if anything, is distinctive about the experience of having such a sense-impression is moot -- remember, for Løkke's Chrysippus the sceptics have not yet pressed that troubling point.)

But this is only part of the story, for cognitive sense-impressions are in Løkke's view only one kind of cognitive impression. There is some evidence that Chrysippus considered "preconceptions" (prolêpseis) to be criteria of truth alongside cognitive sense-impressions. Preconceptions are formed naturally and automatically in humans as a result of the accumulation in our soul of cognitive impressions that are similar to one another. (E.g., when I've seen a number of cats, I get the preconception "cat.") The acquisition of a repertoire of preconceptions that accurately reflects the contents of the world is for the Stoics essential to the development of full rationality in a human. Most scholars have thought that preconceptions are accorded the status of truth-criteria by Chrysippus in an indirect sense: they are trusted to represent the world accurately because they derive from cognitive sense-impressions. But Løkke insists that preconceptions are full-fledged cognitive impressions in their own right. This means that he feels pressure to offer an account of their epistemic warrant in its own right, and the account has to make clear how I can tell which of the various general notions in my head are genuine, truth-criterial preconceptions and which are, rather, mistaken notions (deriving from, e.g., a private cognitive mistake or from accepting a mistaken convention that obtains in my society).

What Løkke suggests on Chrysippus' behalf is the test of consistency: my preconceptions, since they are all true, will all be in complete agreement with one another. But the only way to ascertain which of the various general notions I have are in fact entirely consistent with one another is through careful and self-reflective consideration of their implications, with an eye to revealing latent inconsistencies. On Løkke's account, this is indeed the primary function of philosophical argumentation for the early Stoics: to uncover, clarify, and confirm the natural standards of truth that our souls already contain, our preconceptions. The goal in doing so is to live without making mistakes, and Løkke suggests (plausibly enough) that the "main worry" for the Stoics, the main mistakes that humans make, are the emotions. ("Emotions" here does not mean "feelings" -- everyone has, and should have, feelings -- but rather the feelings we have when we act in a way contrary to reason, because we have given assent to a misevaluation.)

Less plausible is Løkke's further exploration of possible connections between Chrysippus' epistemology and his ethical theory in Chapter 5. He tries to establish that Stoic wisdom (at least as conceived of by Chrysippus) has an important "conative aspect" that is distinct from, and must be developed distinctly from, its "cognitive aspect": it's one thing to acquire the body of knowledge that you need in order to act appropriately, and quite another to develop and preserve in yourself a firm commitment to being guided by that knowledge in your actions. This is an odd view to ascribe to the early Stoics, of all people, since they categorically deny that you could act against your own reasoned view of what is appropriate to do in a given situation. Of course, we ordinary humans can and do act inconstantly, but this is (on the Stoic account) because we waver in our beliefs about what is appropriate. The sage by contrast never acts inconstantly, but this is because a sage possesses knowledge and so does not waver in her beliefs. What suggests to Løkke that the Stoics take wisdom to have the two different aspects he identifies is that they speak of mental "health" (hugieia, the good condition of one's beliefs) and mental "strength" (ischus, the good condition of one's impulses) as two distinct virtues of the soul.[1] But it seems pretty clear that in doing so, they are offering two positive characterizations of one and the same virtuous condition of a wise soul. The sage's steady cognition, which is praiseworthy, entails his or her steadfast conation, which is also praiseworthy. So I think Løkke has got this wrong; but I am also worried by his apparent lack of concern about the absence of evidence for his view. Indeed near the end of the chapter he expresses disappointment that the surviving descriptions of the Stoic sage's "art of living" are "rather one-sided," since they emphasize cognition over conation (p. 109).

Løkke displays throughout the book an impressively thorough command of the ancient source material, and each chapter fairly brims with novel interpretive suggestions. These suggestions are however difficult to evaluate, in part because they are often quite speculative and in part -- and relatedly -- because Løkke engages with rival scholarly views far less often (and in far less detail) than one might reasonably expect. This is somewhat less the case in the crucial fourth chapter, where there is, at least in the footnotes, considerable give-and-take with the secondary literature. But elsewhere he often registers (at best) bare agreement or disagreement with other scholars, even when the topic under discussion is quite controversial (for example, the nature of "sayables" or lekta). What's more, although Løkke asserts in his preface that the book (whose origins lie in a 2004 doctoral thesis) has been recently rewritten in its entirety, he in fact cites no scholarship more recent than 2007. Almost all of the secondary literature he cites is in English -- which is hardly unusual these days, but neither is it to be commended. Hellenistic philosophy is a truly international field of study.

Finally, it must be noted that this book is very difficult to use. There are no indices. Translated Greek and Latin texts are not referenced to any of the standard collections of evidence, such as Hans von Arnim's Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta or A. A. Long and David Sedley's The Hellenistic Philosophers, which makes it inconvenient to consult the original source material. The text contains extensive cross-references, but these are (so far as I could tell) all incorrect -- and grossly so. (For example, on page 32 there is a reference to "pages 42-43 above"; and on page 36 there is a reference to "pages 144-145 below" -- this in a volume of 134 pages.) The volume's editors at Springer should feel ashamed to have allowed it to go to press in this condition, and it is to be hoped that they will remedy the situation.

In conclusion, while this book contains a rich trove of suggestions that specialists (who are in a position to devote the patience and caution that the book requires) may appreciate, it is hard to recommend it to a wide audience.

[1] See Stobaeus at von Arnim, Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta 3. 278.