Knowledge as Acceptable Testimony

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Steven L. Reynolds, Knowledge as Acceptable Testimony, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 216pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107197756.

Reviewed by Martin Kusch, University of Vienna


This book fuses "knowledge-first epistemology" (KFE) with "function-first epistemology" (FFE). KFE rejects the traditional project of defining knowledge. Knowledge is too fundamental to be reduced. But knowledge can be used to define, or characterize, other epistemic concepts. For instance, (mere) belief is "botched knowledge" (Williamson 2000: 446).

FFE holds that key features of our epistemic concepts can best be explained in terms of their functions in our social life. Some FFEs are "genealogical"; they seek to identify these functions with the help of a quasi-historical thought experiment about a hypothetical "epistemic state of nature". The thought experiment is used to answer the question: Why would a community, smaller and simpler than our own, have been motivated to introduce (recognizable predecessors of) our epistemic concepts? The most influential version of such genealogical FFE is Edward Craig's Knowledge and the State of Nature (1990). Craig suggests that the original function of knowledge attributions is to "flag good informants".

Steven Reynolds' study seeks to improve on Craig's little classic. For instance, in his thought experiment concerning a tribe without knowledge, Craig mistakenly allows speakers knowledge-entailing concepts. Reynolds corrects this error. When members of the tribe say "I saw that p" or "I remember that p", they are not claiming knowledge; they are merely relating appearances. Moreover, since Reynolds accepts KFE, his tribe constructs knowledge first, and belief second. Accordingly, the tribesmen and -women are initially restricted to attributing "sayings" (rather than beliefs) to one another. (34)

Reynolds' central example concerns an "inquirer", tribeswoman Hannah, who, in regular intervals, needs to find out whether there are wild onions in a location an hour's walk from the tribe's camp. In order to avoid the excursion when no onions are there, Hannah asks others for information: Have they been at the location? When was this? etc. As time goes by, Hannah notices that some informants are more useful than others. For instance, informants who visited the site recently are better than testifiers who were there months ago. As Craig would have it, Hannah might eventually bundle together the properties that make for useful testifiers, invent a label ("knowledge") for this bundle, and use this label to "flag good informants".

Reynolds demurs. Craig saddles inquirers with too much work; after all, Craig's inquirers need to keep track of the performance of many potential testifiers. Reynolds' alternative is to let potential testifiers themselves do the checking. Potential testifiers evaluate whether they are good informants (whether p) and testify only if they are. The criteria for such evaluations can be thought of as "testimonial rules": "social rules" that govern the conditions under which one ought, or ought not, to offer information to others. Members of the tribe learn and internalize these rules in response to, and motivated by, the approval and disapproval coming from others. The process leads to the introduction of a label, "gnowledge", denoting "the sorts of relations persons have to their sayings when those saying are likely to be helpful" (51-52). Of course, not everything offered as gnowledge fits the bill; this suggests the introduction of "gnelief" as "failed gnowledge" (58).

Ultimately Reynolds is not, of course, interested in gnowledge and gnelief, but in knowledge and belief. And thus, he aims to make plausible that the function served by the former pair -- to wit, securing acceptable testimony -- is also the function served by the latter two. In order to make his case, Reynolds argues that gnowledge fits with the characterization KFE offers for knowledge.

First, like knowledge, so also gnowledge normally requires belief. This is because belief that p is a defeasible sign for the testifier having (had) good evidence for p. (76)

Second, gnowledge is factive. Naturally, sometimes falsehoods can be helpful, too, and sometimes we want more detail than just a bare-bone true answer (like "yes"). And testimony is of course fallible (67).

Third, epistemic "justification is the appearance of gnowledge to the subject . . . " (69). We cannot expect more of our informants than that they refrain from saying that p when it appears to them that they lack gnowledge whether p. According to Reynolds, one can have an appearance that p without having the concepts for thinking that p; thus, even a dog can have the appearance of knowing. This is because "an appearance of our own knowledge is typically the awareness of many things: beliefs, feelings of doubt, perceptual experiences, memories, logical and evidential relationships among beliefs, and so on." (100) Reynolds' account also has a diachronic dimension. It may appear to me now (in 2017) that I saw Donald Trump in Moscow in 2015; even though back in 2015 in Moscow, I had no appearance of seeing Mr. Trump. Hence, I am not now justified in my belief. (109-116) Furthermore, it is possible for us to attribute gnowledge that p to informants even when they do not have the appearance of such gnowledge. This is the basis for externalist intuitions about justification. (70, 115)

With this unique combination of FFE and KFE in place, Reynolds then turns to discussing issues in the epistemology of testimony, doxastic voluntarism and the value of knowledge.

Testimony first. Here the key idea is what Reynolds calls "the social norms justification for accepting testimony". When we lack specific evidence concerning a testifier's reliability with respect to a particular issue, we tacitly reason as follows:

S testifies that p. She has been trained to testify only what she knows. So she is (very likely) expressing knowledge that p, in the absence of indications that she doesn't know whether p. There are no such indications. So (very likely) she knows that p. If S knows that p, then it is true that p. Therefore (very likely) p. (125)

Reynolds maintains that this account is superior to Tyler Burge's (1993) and Richard Moran's (2005) well-known non-reductionist accounts of testimonial justification. In this context Reynolds also offers a "knowledge norm for testimony" as an improvement on the "knowledge norm for assertion". (151)

Doxastic voluntarism is generally thought to be mistaken. Reynolds worries that his account might appear to be committed to it; after all, does not his theory involve us in telling others what they ought to believe? Ought implies can. The gist of Reynolds' response is that "epistemic 'ought' judgements typically function to encourage a change in something other than the beliefs of the person they are about." This "something other" are assertions that fall foul of our epistemic rules for assertion. (190-192)

Finally, why should we prefer knowledge over true belief? The answer falls naturally out of Reynolds' FFE: we prefer knowledge since it is the result of complying with social-testimonial norms of which we collectively approve (195): "The good of knowledge is, as it were, created by our practice of approving it." (206)

This is an intriguing book and one of the most important contributions to genealogical FFE. Reynolds' criticisms of Craig's FFE seem fair and on target. Craig really does give the tribe knowledge-entailing concepts already prior to the introduction of knowledge, and he has little to say about the testimonial rules we want our testifiers to internalize. Moreover, some Craigean epistemologists have struggled to find a way to reconcile FFE with KFE; Reynolds does so in the most convincing fashion. Readers with sympathies for empirical and experimental philosophy, or the sociology of knowledge, will also welcome Reynolds' suggestions according to which our testimonial norms are many and highly diverse; that epistemic norms are social norms; or that epistemology is not a priori. Epistemology at its best is "big-picture theorizing" in light of the empirical results of "empirical anthropology", "social psychology", taken-for-granted "ordinary empirical knowledge", and some intuitions (held in check by experimental philosophy) (8, 119-121). Reynolds' discussion of issues in the epistemology of testimony also deserves praise: it is original, surefooted, and clear.

I now turn to some objections. The main shortcoming of the book is that -- with the exception of a couple of perfunctory footnotes (p. 7, p. 64) -- Reynolds makes no use of the scholarly debate to which Craig's book has given rise. Even Craig's own later discussion of genealogy is absent (2007). This shortcoming matters. Reynolds' argument would have been (even) more compelling if he had engaged with other forms of FFE (some of which are close to his own), or if he had addressed some of the criticisms that have been directed at Craig, but that -- mutatis mutandis -- also apply to this book.

First, Reynolds dedicates three pages (81-83) to the question how his theory relates to Hilary Kornblith's thesis that knowledge is a natural kind, like water or aluminium (2002). Reynolds regards the two analyses as fully compatible. The tribe baptizes certain paradigmatic instances of helpful testimony as "knowledge", and social processes (like the linguistic division of labour) secure the continued reference to this natural kind (83). Unfortunately, this quick rapprochement ignores Kornblith's detailed criticism of Craig in his "Why Should We Care About the Concept of Knowledge?" (2011). This paper maintains that Craig goes wrong in treating knowledge as a social-artificial rather than a natural kind. For Kornblith, since knowledge is a natural kind, we must approach it with the tools of ethology, and abandon all forms of conceptual investigations into knowledge, including those of FFE. This is not compatible with Reynolds' epistemology.

Second, responding to Craig, several authors have drawn attention to other functions of knowledge attributions:

- signalling that inquiry is at an end (Kappel 2010, Kelp 2011, Rysiew 2012);

- identifying propositions we can treat as reasons for acting (McGrath 2015);

- providing assurance (Austin 1946, Lawlor 2013);

- distinguishing between blameless and blameworthy behaviour (Beebe 2012); and

- honouring the subject of knowledge attributions (Kusch 2009).

Some of these authors intend their proposals to be alternative claims about the central role of knowledge attributions (Kappel, Kelp, Lawlor, Rysiew), while others intend them to be complementary (Beebe, Kusch, McGrath). Clearly, some of these suggestions are in the proximity of Reynolds' theory, while others directly contradict it. It would have been helpful to see how Reynolds positions himself relative to these competitors.

Third, given Reynolds' frequent insistence on a continuity between epistemology and the social sciences, it is odd that Bernard Williams' Truth and Truthfulness (2002) is only briefly mentioned in a four-line footnote. Williams offers a genealogy of the social institution of testimony, focused centrally on the question how we can bring testifiers to develop the epistemic virtues of "accuracy" and "sincerity". Williams emphasises that the institution of testimony is a collective good. Individuals who are rational in a purely self-interested way will try to "free-ride": they will seek to obtain accurate and sincere testimony from others without offering anything in return. After all, collecting useful information usually involves costly "investigative investments" (2002: 88). How is the problem of collective action solved? The core of Williams' answer is that accuracy and sincerity (and with them the institution itself) must come to be regarded by community members as shared intrinsic -- rather than as merely instrumental -- values (2002: 90). And to achieve this goal, Williams says, people must be "discouraged or encouraged, sanctioned, shamed, or rewarded". In other words, the structure "of mutual respect and the capacity for shame in the face of oneself and others, is a traditional, indeed archaic, ethical resource, but it is still very necessary" (2002: 44, 121). All this seems to me far too close to Reynolds' position for him to set it aside. Moreover, Williams is arguably one step ahead of Reynolds: Williams recognizes that a focus on social norms must involve bringing social institutions and collective goods into the analysis.

Fourth, and finally, what made Craig's book appealing to many of his readers were his efforts to use FFE to explain the intuitions behind, and the partial truth of, a wide variety of epistemic positions, from reliabilism to modal epistemology, from contextualism to scepticism. Reynolds' focus is much narrower insofar as his main goal is to vindicate KFE. Scepticism makes no appearance. And neither do the recent debates over whether a genealogical FFE supports a contextualist or a relativist semantics for knowledge attributions (Greco 2007, Hannon 2013, Henderson 2009, McKenna 2013, MacFarlane 2014: 311-19). Undoubtedly, Reynolds' study would have considerably gained in interest had he reflected on which of these views best fit with Knowledge as Acceptable Testimony.

These objections should not overshadow the many merits of the book. It deserves to be read not just by philosophers interested in genealogies but all epistemologists.


For comments on a first draft I am indebted to Michael Hannon, Robin McKenna and Matthieu Queloz. I gratefully acknowledge the financial support of the ERC (AG #339382).


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