Knowledge Ascriptions

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Jessica Brown and Mikkel Gerken (eds.), Knowledge Ascriptions, Oxford University Press, 2012, 300pp., $75.00 (hbk), 9780199693702.

Reviewed by Stephen Hetherington, The University of New South Wales


Picture a special issue of an epistemology journal; double its length; add a dour Cezanne cover. The result is a book. It could be this one. To read this book is speedily to be immersed in jargon, presumptions, and programs from this moment in the flow of what we hope is epistemology's development. This book is topical and somewhat technical. Its intended audience is epistemologists and aspiring epistemologists. Like much current epistemology, it is reflecting upon language, psychology, and methodology.

From how many directions can knowledge ascriptions be illuminatingly analysed, evaluated, embedded, and so on? The book's helpful editorial introduction, by Jessica Brown and Mikkel Gerken, advertises a linguistic turn, a cognitive turn, and a social turn. Turns? Maybe. Certainly there are such forays occurring within current epistemology. The book's chapters make that manifest. They do it well, too. They are individually strong and collectively well blended. This is a very useful book. (I will comment briefly on each chapter.)

Brown's "Words, Concepts, and Epistemology" confronts a concern many of us have felt. Is there a danger of some recent epistemology's not really being epistemological? For instance, might even a book called Knowledge Ascriptions not really be so much about knowledge? The worry is whether we can understand epistemology as not being first and foremost about linguistic phenomena and "thought-experiment judgements" (p. 31), even as we encourage reflection upon thought and language -- such as knowledge ascriptions -- in order to understand whatever epistemology is about first and foremost. Brown's carefully argued answer is optimistic. And the next three chapters, in effect, seize upon that licence. They defend impurist conceptions of knowledge: pragmatic encroachment (Jeremy Fantl and Matthew McGrath, in "Arguing for Shifty Epistemology"), interest-relative invariantism (often called IRI -- Brian Weatherson in "Knowledge, Bets, and Interests"), and contextualism (Michael Blome-Tillmann in "Presuppositional Epistemic Contextualism and the Problem of Known Presuppositions").

Fantl and McGrath introduce elegantly their much-discussed pragmatic encroachment view of knowledge.[1] Their chapter is strategic. What should be our investigative emphasis when evaluating such a view? We should look initially to principles, not single cases. By all means, consult your intuitions. But even these are best directed at principles. (Which principles in particular? Fallibilism and Actionability: p. 65.)

Weatherson's argument is centred upon the thesis that "knowledge plays an important role in decision theory" (p. 77). His central conditions are that " (a) it is legitimate to write something onto a decision table iff the decision maker knows it to be true, and (b) it is legitimate to leave a possible state of affairs off a decision table iff the decision maker knows it not to obtain" (p. 77). (But does this entail that, when one does not know that p and one also does not know that not-p, one cannot legitimately write p onto a decision table yet one also cannot legitimately leave off one's decision table?)

Blome-Tillmann advocates a refinement of David Lewis' contextualism[2] -- specifically, Lewis' Rule of Attention. Are attributions of knowledge compromised even by attending to a skeptical possibility? Lewis: yes. Blome-Tillmann: no -- because only when we take a skeptical possibility seriously do our knowledge ascriptions properly give way to knowledge denials. Blome-Tillmann argues instead for a presuppositional epistemic contextualism. A speaker need only "pragmatically presuppose the negations of sceptical hypotheses" if those possibilities are to "be properly ignored in [a context] C -- even though attention may have been drawn to such possibilities" (p. 106). (I found this puzzling. One's not actually dreaming is compatible with one's possibly dreaming. And the latter possibility, not the former actuality, is all that a Cartesian skeptical argument needs. Can we set aside that possibility by pragmatically presupposing that an epistemic subject is not even possibly dreaming? That would hardly be fair to the Cartesian skeptical reasoning.) Blome-Tillmann ends by "add[ing] another group of worlds to the set of worlds that are epistemically relevant while (potentially) being incompatible with the presuppositions in C -- namely, precisely those worlds that are ignored because they are eliminated by the speakers' evidence". (Yet some skeptical thinking may well reply that various skeptical possibilities undermine the power of the evidence to be eliminative.)

Those three chapters are questioning whether we can understand knowledge in all its forms by using only traditional epistemic terms. Another way of posing that question is to take seriously an anti-intellectualism about attributions of knowledge-how; for intellectualism implies that knowledge-how is a form of knowledge at all only because of epistemic characteristics inherent in the knowledge-that inherent in the knowledge-how. Ephraim Glick's chapter ("Abilities and Know-How Attributions") is anti-intellectualist. He provides some well-organised linguistic observations, gathered around the idea "that there is a sort of learning that requires the acquisition of ability" (p. 125) -- and thereby the idea that some cases of knowledge-how are abilities. This is an understated but clear-headed chapter.

 Now the book's emphasis shifts, for a while, to cognitive psychology and experimental philosophy. This begins with Mikkel Gerken's chapter ("On the Cognitive Basis of Knowledge Ascriptions") defending a non-skeptical strict invariantism. Need we be so swayed by intuitions calling us away from such a traditional view? Not if Gerken is right to gesture at an epistemic focal bias strategy, "integrated with the general dual process framework concerning human judgment" (p. 143) -- including instances of supposedly intuitive judgement. One phenomenon discussed by a few of the book's chapters is the disparity between what are usually called High Stakes cases and Low Stakes ones. These are paired hypothetical situations between which, we are told, all that differs is the practical significance of the respective epistemic subject's having, or not having, the knowledge in question.[3]

Gerken asks whether respondents to at least some High Stakes cases might be in the grip of cognitive illusion when denying that knowledge is present. He offers a Principle of Epistemic Satisficing (p. 155): "Normally, an agent, A, forms epistemic judgments on the basis of a prima facie reason that is arrived at by processing only a limited part of the evidence that is available to A." And Gerken calls upon the possible distinction between type 1 cognitive processes and type 2 ones. Some dual process theorists tell us that type 2 processes can "exhibit a focal bias" (p. 162), so that "certain alternatives are not adequately processed" (p. 164). I do have one question about Gerken's use of this idea. He is asking about "a putative discrepancy between the judgments of epistemologists and participants" in a given case (p. 164). Yet surely some epistemological judgments are no less vulnerable to these possible cognitive illusions when assessing a particular case. I am not quite sure how extensively Gerken is willing to apply his doubts to our own attempts at epistemological thinking -- in particular, our epistemological assessments of knowledge's presence or absence.

I have a similar concern about Jennifer Nagel's chapter ("Mindreading in Gettier Cases and Skeptical Pressure Cases"). Her leading question is excellent: what cognitive strategies guide our intuitive reactions to, respectively, Gettier cases and (what she calls) skeptical pressure cases? As in: yes, intuitively that Gettiered belief is not knowledge; and yes, intuitively there is an appeal in skeptical denials of knowledge. Is the latter, but not the former, reaction a cognitive illusion? We may wish it to be so. (Well, I do not. I think that the former reaction is an illusion.)[4] Yet "there are some deep similarities in the underlying causes of Gettier intuitions and skeptical intuitions" (p. 173). How, then, do we embrace the Gettier intuitions while discarding the skeptical ones? Nagel's answer is influenced by some experimental philosophy results. (I am unsure, though, whether she does justice to skeptical cases (pp. 186-7). The case she offers (p. 174) -- her (B), a variation on the stopped-clock case -- is one where the momentary situation can be checked on and subsequently transcended. But at least in radically skeptical cases this is not possible. In these, the epistemic subject is fundamentally estranged from some evidence to which an onlooker might have epistemic access.)

With that focus upon experimental philosophy in mind, is it possible that a shift of focus to a more empirically oriented epistemology of comparatively 'normal' epistemic subjects should affect also the epistemic criteria by which we assess our own epistemological efforts (treating epistemologists as epistemic subjects)? Even more so than Nagel's chapter, Ángel Pinillos' contribution ("Knowledge, Experiments, and Practical Interests") is an exercise in experimental philosophy. He argues for an IRI. Pinillos charts supposed sensitivities to "stakes (in a very broad sense)" of "intuitive knowledge attributions" (p. 213n.). And he argues for this being "better explained by IRI than contextualism" (p. 213). To me, this felt like a narrowly construed debate. First, could stakes include the strength of one's knowing? If people are asked "Do you know?" rather than "Do you know?", the former might elicit more attributions. What would that show? Could it be that there are corresponding strengths of knowledge? This is worth investigating, potentially enlarging the debate.[5] Second, Pinillos links (p. 206) the IRI-versus-contextualism debate to this principle, RKP:[6]

Where one's choice is p-dependent, it is appropriate to treat the proposition that p as a reason for acting if and only if you know that p.

Many epistemologists will welcome this linking. I think I do, too. Even so, I worried that, in effecting that sort of linking, Pinillos' is inferring from his experimental philosophy surveys more loosely than we tend to require in non-experimental philosophy papers. Think about how philosophical debate typically proceeds: for example, fine point begets finer point begets astutely observed non-entailment begets ever-so-careful refinement begets . . . . When an epistemologist reaches for a suggestion a priori as to what knowledge is like, should her proposal be subjected to higher epistemic standards than a similar suggestion based on some experimental philosophy surveys of how a bunch of people use the word "know"?

Might there be some epistemically optimal blending of the a priori and the empirical within epistemological theorising? Probably not. But there are better or worse blendings. James Beebe's chapter ("Social Functions of Knowledge Attributions") is an impressive example of this. He aims to complement empirically some of Edward Craig's a priori thoughts[7] on why we might ever have developed, and why we might still use, a concept of knowledge. Could part of the story be our needing to know who is blameworthy -- morally; socially -- within various social settings? Does evolutionary game theory help us to understand that? Will experimental philosophy then refine our understanding of it?

Beebe's pluralist project claims to identify one possible type of reason or use for our concept of knowledge. That Craigian aim animates also the book's excellent final two chapters, by Jennifer Lackey ("Group Knowledge Attributions") and Patrick Rysiew ("Epistemic Scorekeeping"). We talk as if group knowledge exists. But does it? How should we conceive of it? And can our attempting to do so inform our conception of knowledge more generally? Lackey argues against Craig's influential picture of knowers in general as reliable informants. Taking her cue from how we attribute knowledge to groups, she defends a view of knowledge attributions as identifying reliable sources of information. Lackey claims only to be describing one "central purpose" of such attributions (p. 267).

As does Rysiew when offering a pragmatism about one central use of knowledge attributions. Need we discard a traditional semantics for such attributions? Rysiew denies that claim. In line with those who place such importance upon High Stakes cases and Low Stakes ones, he tells us that

The big challenge for traditional (insensitive invariantist) theorists in the recent literature on knowledge ascriptions has been to explain what's going on in various specific cases (or pairs of cases) where there is a piece or pattern of knowledge-attributing behaviour that is prima facie at odds with the traditional approach. (p. 286)

And although many epistemologists have recently been reaching for non-traditional semantic accounts, Rysiew resists that trend. His

view predicts that there can be cases, for example, in which a person knows, even though it would be wrong of them to take the proposition in question as 'settled', to not inquire further, to not seek more evidence, and so on. (p. 283)

Of course, one result of continuing such inquiry, of seeking more evidence, etc., could well be an improvement in one's epistemic position regarding a particular p. Rysiew assumes (p. 283) that one would not thereby improve one's knowledge that p. He then joins (p. 288) with some others, such as Christoph Kelp and David Henderson (and I share their views about this), in finding problematic contextualism's ability to do justice to our cross-contextual uses of knowledge attributions.

Nonetheless, one of those cross-contextual uses involves comparing situations where one's epistemic position regarding p has been improved -- all the while maintaining one's knowing that p. Could we therefore consider adding to Rysiew's picture a gradualist-albeit-non-contextualist semantics for "knows"? This dimension of gradational variability would be knowledge's epistemic aspect. And in saying this we can, if we wish, retain a traditional conception of what factors contribute to the semantics of knowledge attributions. Contrary to what Timothy Williamson seemingly implies (and is endorsed by Rysiew, p. 290), our admitting a gradational conception of knowing need not plunge us into a wild ocean of competing and vague dimensions of gradational variability for a piece of knowledge. We may begin with this simple point: the better the justification, the stronger the knowledge.[8]

This book should remind us that we live in energetic and fascinating epistemological times. Fresh ideas growing wild: so many are being introduced and tested, cultivated almost daily within an epistemological atmosphere of increased methodological self-awareness. New links are being proposed and charted between traditional epistemological concepts and others, such as those (appearing in this book) of action and of blame. These links could well end up enriching epistemology by showing, for example, how to theorise about knowledge itself by theorising about much that would formerly not have been deemed at all epistemic. Could knowing be both constituted by, and constitutive of, these other phenomena? Might knowing be that constitutively central to far more than we had anticipated? Could epistemology itself in such ways be even more philosophically pivotal than many of its enthusiasts had already taken it to be? This book is a worthy contributor to that current conceptual ferment.

[1] For their fuller view, see Knowledge in an Uncertain World (New York: Oxford University Press, 2009).

[2] "Elusive Knowledge", Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74 (1996), 549-67.

[3] For the standard versions of these cases, see Keith DeRose, "Contextualism and Knowledge Attributions", Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 52 (1992), 913-29, and Stewart Cohen, "Contextualism, Skepticism, and the Structure of Reasons", Philosophical Perspectives 13 (1999), 57-89.

[4] For a first version of this reaction, see my "The Gettier illusion: Gettier-partialism and infallibilism", Synthese 188 (2012), 217-30.

[5] Especially so, given some of the philosophers who have accepted that there can be different degrees or grades of knowledge, even of a single truth. See my How To Know (Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2011), sec. 2.7.

[6] This Reason-Knowledge Principle is from John Hawthorne and Jason Stanley, "Knowledge and Action", The Journal of Philosophy 105 (2008), 571-90.

[7] Knowledge and the State of Nature (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1990).

[8] For more details on how we might proceed from this point, see my Good Knowledge, Bad Knowledge (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2001) and How To Know, op. cit.