Knowledge, Belief, and God: New Insights in Religious Epistemology

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Matthew A. Benton, John Hawthorne, and Dani Rabinowitz (eds.), Knowledge, Belief, and God: New Insights in Religious Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2018, 345pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198798705.

Reviewed by T. Ryan Byerly, University of Sheffield


This collection of sixteen new essays in religious epistemology is among the central outputs of the three-year research project New Insights and Directions in Religious Epistemology. In this review, I begin with some comments about the collection as a whole, then briefly identify some of the key insights contained within thirteen of the chapters, before focusing in more detail on the remaining three chapters which, in my judgment, are among the best candidates for identifying fruitful new directions for research in religious epistemology.

The editors describe mainstream epistemology as a field that "has enjoyed a fertile period of intense theorizing" in which topics of perennial interest to epistemologists "have given way to lively new epistemological interests" while "many central questions in epistemology proper have been given some revolutionary answers" (1). Among the major developments in epistemology, the editors specifically identify Timothy Williamson's knowledge-first epistemology, epistemological theorizing focused on the semantics and pragmatics of knowledge ascriptions and denials, the flourishing of social epistemology and formal epistemology, and theorizing about epistemic defeat. Regrettably, they claim, "there has been surprisingly little infiltration of these new approaches or ideas into philosophy of religion" (3). Indeed, by contrast with mainstream epistemology, religious epistemology has been preoccupied with examining a single "dominant perspective" -- reformed epistemology. The aim of this volume's contributors is accordingly to "draw on" the more diverse recent developments in mainstream epistemology "in order to generate new directions for religious epistemology, and to reinvigorate interest in questions that have historically enjoyed much attention from philosophers of religion" (3-4).

So understood, the volume is both ambitious and should have broad appeal among philosophers of religion. With respect to its ambitions, it would be no mean feat if essays were able to generate new directions for the field of religious epistemology in the sense of establishing novel agendas for research in the area. With respect to breadth of appeal, it may be that the volume is of special interest to those with interests in the fine-tuning argument or the epistemology of religious diversity, religious testimony, or religious experience, as eleven of the sixteen essays are concerned primarily with these topics. Yet, the full menu of topics includes much more, as we will shortly see.

I would however raise two concerns with the editors' description of the collection which pose some challenge either to the achievability of the book's ambitions or to its breadth of appeal. First, their one-paragraph description of the landscape of contemporary religious epistemology as dominated by adherence to the perspective of reformed epistemology and largely ignorant of the developments in mainstream epistemology upon which the collection focuses comes across as at best a misleading overgeneralization and at worst plainly false. For example, it is somewhat striking -- all the more because he is a contributor -- that Richard Swinburne's longstanding program of applying the formal apparatus of Bayesian epistemology to the epistemology of theism and Christian doctrines is given no mention in the editors' depiction of the landscape of contemporary religious epistemology. We might similarly note that, while there is certainly room for continuing development in the epistemology of religious disagreement and religious testimony, it is just as certainly not the case that these areas have been entirely ignored by religious epistemologists. The more observations of this sort are accurate, the less we might expect the essays to achieve the more lofty ambitions of establishing genuinely new directions for research in religious epistemology, as opposed to achieving the more modest aims of providing insights into ongoing debates in the area.

Second, while the appeal of the essays is undeniably broad, there is a particular, well-represented crowd of mainstream epistemologists whose perspective is notably side-lined. No mention of virtue epistemology can be found in the editors' introduction; virtue epistemology is not one of the four categories into which the essays are organised; and no essay sets out with the express intention to engage primarily with virtue epistemology. I will suggest somewhat paradoxically below that several of the key new directions identified by the essays include directions in which virtue epistemology has a quite significant role to play. But the point here is that it is a noteworthy lacuna that no essay is primarily concerned with addressing an epistemological perspective that has been called "the dominant viewpoint in contemporary epistemology" (Pritchard 2013: 236).

Despite these concerns, the volume is replete with new insights into ongoing debates in religious epistemology broadly construed. Charity Anderson opens the section on the history of religious epistemology by arguing that a key overlooked ingredient in Hume's argument against the rationality of believing miracle reports is the claim that the bad track-record of testimony to the miraculous provides an undercutting defeater for any instance of testimony to the miraculous, in the absence of special reasons for trusting the testifier. Richard Cross's contribution compares the views of Aquinas and Duns Scotus on the rationality of Christian belief, arguing that Aquinas's greater scepticism regarding the reliability of human belief-forming processes led him to adopt an externalist view of reasonable (Christian) belief, whereas Scotus's greater optimism regarding human ability to detect unreliable belief-forming processes led him to adopt an internalist conception. Billy Dunaway, in something of a reversal of the pattern exemplified in most of the essays, argues that an examination of Scotus's argument against divine illumination as a solution to sceptical worries should inform mainstream contemporary epistemology, leading to refinements of principles employed in anti-risk epistemology.

The next four chapters prominently feature the application of formal methods to topics of interest in contemporary religious epistemology. Isaac Choi, in the first of three essays on the fine-tuning argument, aims to defuse the normalizability and coarse-tuning objections to the argument by appealing to the view that the proper approach to measuring knowledge of infinitely many claims is via a subset principle rather than a one-to-one correspondence principle. Hans Halvorson develops a theological critique of the fine-tuning argument, maintaining that if God can be expected to create a life-permitting universe, then God can also be expected to establish favorable chances that a life-permitting universe develops by selecting laws of nature yielding this result. John Hawthorne and Yoaav Isaacs employ a Bayesian formulation of the fine-tuning argument to show that it is a "straightforwardly legitimate argument," emphasizing repeatedly how assigning (rough) numbers to key probabilities, such as the prior probability of theism and the conditional probabilities of finely-tuned laws and life given atheism versus theism, proves illuminating. In the final essay, Roger White argues that it would make little difference to the problem of religious disagreement if the universe contained infinitely many people representing each of infinitely many different religious and non-religious perspectives. What matters, rather, is the limiting ratio of agreement to disagreement within this population, as compared with the ratio one would expect to find given one's views -- a lesson that appears relevant for the non-infinite problem of religious disagreement.

Max Baker-Hytch begins the Social Epistemology section by arguing that the fact that there are widely diverse religious beliefs held on the basis of testimony does not show that religious beliefs held on the basis of testimony are unreliably formed, nor that they are subject to a defeater, but instead that those who hold religious beliefs in this way will not know that they know the contents of these beliefs. Paulina Sliwa concludes this section with an essay focusing on the desiderative and practical (know-how) dimensions of religious and mundane faith, which she maintains may be acquired via social practices of showing rather than telling.

Matthew Benton begins the Rational Epistemology section by developing a novel Pascalian argument, arguing that if the thesis of pragmatic encroachment is known by a subject to be true, then this puts her in a knowledge asymmetry with respect to believing versus disbelieving theism, generating rational pressure for her to believe. In the first of two essays on religious experience, Keith DeRose explains why he doubts that anyone knows whether God exists, by arguing that those who are in the best position to know whether God exists -- those with very high-quality religious experiences -- do not know that God exists, since there are too many others who have had similarly high-quality religious experiences but who lost the faith and came to view their earlier confident selves as suffering from a delusion of knowledge. In the second essay, Swinburne explains what sense the key terms "belief," "seems," "justification," and "defeater" must have for Phenomenal Conservativism to be true, and then goes on to apply Phenomenal Conservativism to religious experience, arguing that, in the absence of defeaters, an experiential inclination to believe there is a God provides greater justification for believing there is a God than an experiential inclination to believe there is anything else provides for believing there is such a thing. Sandwiched between these two essays is a contribution by Margot Strohminger and Juhani Yli-Vakkuri which seeks to provide a Williamsonian defence of a moderate kind of modal scepticism similar to that championed by Peter van Inwagen, but based on the idea that knowing the possibility of a proposition increases in difficulty the more distant that possibility is from actuality.

We're left with three essays I've selected for more in-depth discussion. The first is Dani Rabinowitz's on the epistemology of repentance. The main question on which it focuses is whether one can know via introspection that one has repented of each of one's sins. Rabinowitz motivates interest in the question primarily in the context of Judaism, informed by Maimonides's conceptualization of repentance. In this context, it would be important for each person to be able to know via introspection that she had repented of each of her sins, because this would be the only way she could legitimately experience spiritual catharsis, feeling forgiven by God. Yet, Rabinowitz raises a number of problems for how a person could know whether she had repented of each of her sins. The most interesting of these is motivated by Williamson's defence of the anti-luminosity of mental states. Rabinowitz proposes, for example, that repentance of a sin requires sincere regret of that sin and sincere resolve not to commit that sin anymore, and notes that many sins involve emotions, such as one's enjoyment of the freedom to act independently of God's wishes or commands. Insofar as emotions such as these are subject to borderline cases and so are not luminous, there will be cases in which people will not be able to know whether they have repented of each of their sins.

The essay's focus on this puzzle about repentance motivated primarily within Judaism may make it seem of narrow interest. This may be even more so to the extent that the force of the puzzle depends on a striking view of Maimonides regarding the mysteriousness of the metric whereby God weighs sins (88). Yet, I would suggest that in fact the essay points toward a fruitful area for future research in religious epistemology that is of much broader interest -- namely, the religious significance of the anti-luminosity of the mental. Many religious traditions take seriously the idea that we can have "hidden faults" (Psalm 19:12) which may include mental faults; and religious practices, such as mindfulness meditation in Buddhism, sometimes appear designed to enable practitioners to hone their skills in developing self-knowledge and in gaining control of the relevant mental features that would constitute such faults. There are interesting philosophical questions to investigate concerning the religious importance of exposing and eradicating such faults, and about the (perhaps eschatological) potential of human beings to overcome them. Insofar as there are skills or strengths of character associated with the project of overcoming hidden faults, there is an important role for virtue epistemology to play within such research.

Rachel Elizabeth Fraser's essay focuses on explaining how a kind of testimonial pessimism exemplified by medieval mystics could be accounted for in terms of tacit commitments to positions in the philosophy of language -- specifically, an emotionist semantics or a strong reading of the de re. To remain brief, I'll confine my comments to the former. Medieval mystic authors were keen to restrict the readership of their treatises, writing for example "I do not desire that this book should be seen by worldly chatterers, public self-praisers or fault finders, newsmongers" (207). To at least some extent these restrictions were motivated by epistemological concerns -- roughly, that the wrong kinds of recipients just wouldn't get the message, so that the testimony of the mystic would fail to transmit. In order for the testimony to transmit, the recipients needed to have been transformed by divine grace, which would include changes in their affective dispositions. One way to make sense of such pessimism would be to attribute to the medieval authors a tacit commitment to an emotionist semantics, according to which adequate grasp of at least some pertinent concepts requires an appropriate profile of affective dispositions. As an illustration, Fraser points to Jesse Prinz's (2007) emotionist semantics for "wrong" according to which a person has the concept of wrong only if, given the supposition that x is wrong, they are disposed to feel disapprobation toward x. A parallel approach could be taken to make sense of the testimonial pessimism of the medieval mystics, since they supposed that those they wished to exclude from their readership did not possess the requisite affective dispositions when it came to key religious terminology.

Fraser's piece points toward (at least) two fruitful avenues for research in religious epistemology. One is simply the project of further developing and evaluating emotionist semantics for religious terminology of the kind toward which she gestures. As she writes, her project is "exploratory and suggestive" (207), and she does not aim either to defend or to object to such a semantics. The second avenue concerns the broader project of identifying and evaluating the range of possible ways in which moral or affective features of a person can make a difference for her epistemic standing with respect to religious claims. The idea that such features are epistemically relevant for religious belief is not isolated to the mystics Fraser references, and while some research has been done on the topic of how such features may be epistemically relevant for religious belief (e.g., Wainwright 1995), there may be additional novel proposals which, like Fraser's, are worthy of further attention. Here again it is plausible that virtue epistemology or virtue theory more broadly has a role to play, as many of the relevant features will be characterological.

Finally, Jennifer Lackey's piece is primarily a defence of her novel expert-as-advisor model of expertise over against the currently "standard" (228) expert-as-authority model of expertise. The expert-as-authority model is one according to which expert testimony that p is appropriately treated as providing the recipient with pre-emptive reason for believing p, such that the recipient should forego considering any further evidence she might have concerning p and believe p simply on the basis of the expert's testimony. The expert-as-advisor model, by contrast, maintains that expert testimony that p simply provides (possibly quite strong) evidence that p that the recipient should weigh alongside any other evidence she has concerning p. Lackey brings forward a host of interesting objections against the expert-as-authority model, leading her to the striking conclusion that "there are no rational beliefs grounded in authority" (236) and "experts should always be regarded as advisors" (239). The shift to an expert-as-advisor model has the consequence that "certain features of the proffered testimony become far more important than when the testimony is authoritative" (239). For example, given the shift, it matters for a person's expertise how good they are "at effectively clarifying the terrain, or at being a sensitive listener, or at being open-minded to the issues that are of concern" (240) to their audience. As such -- and this is the key point Lackey wishes to stress -- there are a host of features via which experts can be identified, even in the face of disagreement between experts.

Some readers may find that they are, like myself, neither convinced by Lackey's objections to the expert-as-authority model nor by her expert-as-advisor model. I worry, for instance, that it is close to an obvious empirical falsehood that all experts are, by virtue of their expertise, excellent advisors in the sense Lackey extols (being good listeners, etc.). Nonetheless, I would propose that the ideal of the excellent advisor or something in its near neighborhood provides a compelling locus for future scholarship to focus upon in both mainstream and religious epistemology. As Lackey explicitly notes, theorizing such an ideal "is a place where the intellectual and moral virtues are relevant" (239-40). And indeed, given the relative neglect of so-called other-regarding intellectual virtues within contemporary virtue epistemology (Kawall 2002), there remains significant scope for examining the nature of those traits that help to make one an excellent advisor. Moreover, there may also be interesting questions to ask specifically about traits of excellent advisors in the religious domain. For example, it may be that theistic religious seekers are especially interested in gaining distinctively personal knowledge of God, and that certain character traits in spiritual advisors are especially suited for enabling seekers to gain this kind of knowledge (cf. here Sliwa's contribution).

This collection is brimming with insights for religious epistemology and more sparingly contains signposts toward new directions for the field. It is a striking feature of the book that while it appears to have been conceived so as largely to largely overlook developments in virtue epistemology, some of the most fecund new directions toward which its contributors gesture are ones in which virtue epistemology will be distinctively relevant.


Pritchard, Duncan. 2013. "Epistemic Virtue and the Epistemology of Education." Journal of Philosophy of Education 47, 2: 236-47.

Prinz, Jesse. 2007. The Emotional Construction of Morals. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Kawall, Jason. 2002. "Other-regarding Epistemic Virtues." Ratio 25, 3: 257-275.

Wainwright, William. 1995. Reason and the Heart. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.