Knowledge by Agreement: the Programme of Communitarian Epistemology

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Kusch, Martin, Knowledge by Agreement: the Programme of Communitarian Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2002, 303pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199251223.

Reviewed by David Henderson, University of Memphis


As explained by Kusch, a communitarian epistemology is one that holds (a) that “’knowledge’ and its cognates, like ‘know’ and ‘knower’, marks a social status,” and (b) that the fundamental or primary possessor of knowledge are groups of people rather than the individual. In this “dialogical exposition” of communitarian epistemology, Kusch discusses a wide range of philosophers, borrowing elements from various positions while criticizing each. In doing so, he seeks to piece together the central planks in his communitarian epistemology, to exhibit their interrelations, and to motivate the choice of just those elements in preference to more familiar philosophical doctrines. The result affords a firm understanding of the radically alternative epistemology that he proposes (one can have confidence that Kusch really does believe what he seems to hold), and why he proposes it (one can appreciate the motivation for the central planks and how they fit together). The drawback of discussing many alternative positions and fundamental arguments in the space of one book is that the reader sometimes feels that the compact discussion of positions and issues is too quick. This is not to say that Kusch’s presentations of competitors’ positions are unfair—he typically provides fair sketches—rather, it is to say that one feels that the issues as outlined deserve more sustained give and take than provided. Such misgivings are perhaps inevitable in such a compact and yet encompassing presentation.

The book has three parts. The first provides a communitarian epistemology of testimony. Here Kusch argues that testimony, at least testimony that is a part of a community agreement, is generative of knowledge. He argues that one should recognize a kind of “communal performative” testimony (distributed across the individual instances of testimony), and that communal performatives constitutes knowledge on the part of the community. The second aspires to a communitarian epistemology of empirical belief. Here Kusch hopes to demonstrate that the communitarian epistemology provides superior answers to epistemologists’ own questions. However, he also recognizes that a significant stumbling block to the appreciation of the communitarian understanding and answers springs from “certain ‘realist’ or ‘absolutist’ intuitions about language, truth, and objectivity.” Thus, the final part of the book is devoted to developing a “finitist semantics” supporting a distinctive form of relativism regarding truth and objectivity.

On a traditional epistemological understanding of testimony, whether an individual is justified in accepting or forming a belief on the basis of testimony turns on facts about that individual. Such accounts come in reductionist and antireductionist versions. On reductionist accounts, an individual is justified in accepting a belief on the basis of testimony (and can there have knowledge) only when possessing a basis for trust that employs epistemically justificatory processing of a non-testimonial sort. For example, such a basis might consist of experientially based reasons for thinking that the person testifying (or such persons generally) is (are) trustworthy. Alternatively, for an externalist, it might consist in a reliable sensitivity to such trustworthiness. In either case, the epistemic footing of (any piece of) testimony is understood in terms of epistemic processes that are fundamentally non-testimonial in character—and all this is understood at the level of the individual epistemic agent. On anti-reductionist accounts, in contrast, the individual agent need not have any vindication for taking the interlocutor to be trustworthy—need have no reasons for thinking the interlocutor trustworthy, need have no sensitivity to trustworthiness, and perhaps need have no belief in the trustworthiness of the interlocutor. Rather, agents are thought to have some entitlement to accept testimony—absent undermining reasons and without any check for such undermining reasons. This entitlement is to be understood as constituting testimony as a fundamental epistemic channel or modality on a par with experience. Again, all this has to do with epistemically desirable or justificatory processes on the part of an individual forming a testimonial belief. Kusch characterizes the main outlines of such debates. However, his ultimate treatment of reductionism and antireductionism is remarkably dismissive—he writes off both as fundamentally misguided insofar as they each are committed to individualism. The problem, as he sees it, is that what is called for on the part of individuals varies with social contexts, so that any account at the level of the individual will be a distorting generalization.

Kusch explains that individualistic epistemologies all mistake a stylized picture of certain epistemic contexts for a general epistemological account—the result being a distorted understanding of other epistemological contexts. To flesh out his picture of a range of epistemic contexts and varying contextual demands on the individual he elaborates a kind of neo-Wittgensteinian contextualist epistemology that found condensed earlier expression in a well-known piece by David Annis. On such a view, what is required in order for an agent to be justified is no more or less than what would enable that agent to induce or command agreement in that agent’s social context. Justification is thus a matter of what a historically situated community of inquirers will or would need in order to reach a consensus or agreement on the point in question. On this view, all epistemic norms are local—norms of some historical community. Generalizing from those contexts in which members of one’s epistemic community will not themselves be satisfied until one has produced reasons for thinking that one’s sources are trustworthy, individualist epistemologists of testimony have been led to reductive accounts. Generalizing from contexts where one’s epistemic community is ready to take some testimony at face value, no questions asked, individualists have been led to construct anti-reductionist accounts. Kusch insists that communities employ a mix of contextual demands—thereby constituting what makes for justification—and that neither reductionism nor anti-reductionism is correct.

The last paragraph related a radical claim, the claim that what makes for justification is wholly a matter of local social norms—a matter completely of what would induce agreement within an epistemic community. But, in advancing his communitarian account, Kusch is committed to a yet more radical claim: that knowledge as well as justification is wholly a matter of what would induce such agreement, that considered agreement within a community constitutes knowledge and justification. Such agreement evinces the satisfaction of local epistemic norms, and such are the only norms or standards there are—the very stuff of epistemic normativity, on Kusch’s account. The title, Knowledge by Agreement, is not hyperbole—it reflects the doctrine developed therein. Knowledge and justification are said to be social statuses—possessed just when the group agrees. An agent is said to have justification only in a group that is willing to concede the point on which the agent thereby comes to have justification. ‘Concede the point’ might be too weak a formulation—borrowing language from Brandom, the group must, it seems, be in accord in undertaking commitment to the point in question, and to related points of course, and in according entitlements to others likewise committed. Further, on this account, I know only when we know—as our agreement reflects satisfaction of the local epistemic norms that are said to constitute knowledge, which must in the first instance be shared knowledge. Kusch makes the point vividly and interestingly by insisting that the shared commitments be understood as constituting a kind of communal performative. Justification and knowledge (and thus truth and meaning) are bestowed in a kind of community process that is at least of the same genus as the performatives by which a couple comes to be married at the performative pronouncement that they are.

At the very least, this much can be said in praise of this book: it unflinchingly develops various strands that would seem to be needed to defend a communitarian epistemology of the fairly radical sort suggested. If justification and knowledge are to be social statuses, then so must be truth, for example, and the author obliges by advancing accounts of semantics and truth of sorts that would seem to be needed. In each case, something more than a promissory note and less than a fully elaborated and defended account is managed. The discussion moves along crisply (sometimes too quickly, as readers may repeatedly feel that there remains much to say about the particular issue under review).

I would like to suggest two related misgivings. Let me begin by considering a demand on an adequate epistemology that Kusch employs against alternatives to communitarianism. It is one that I believe that he cannot himself meet. All individualistic epistemology, and even social epistemologies that are not communitarian epistemologies, are said to be unable to account for the normative constraints on beliefs. Here, Kusch’s dismissal of foundationalist and coherentist epistemologies is representative:

Rational constraint cannot be found where both positions are looking for it. It cannot be found among elements in the depth of the individual mind—whatever the route by which the elements have entered. It is not that foundationalism or coherentism has not yet found the appropriate elements. It is that individual-psychological facts or worldly facts on their own are not normative. No facts or events can constrain a mind; only norms can (p. 97).

Norms, by which Kusch understands social norms, are here advanced as necessary (and adequate) to provide or constitute the needed distinction between merely seeming right and being right—a distinction that is of a piece with real normativity. This theme that alternative epistemologies cannot provide for real normativity is sounded repeatedly in the book: for example, regarding Reliabilism (p. 110), regarding Davidson’s epistemology, where it seems that the normativity must arise from the interpreter’s community, and this community is not a focus of that epistemology (p. 129), regarding versions of contextualism, such as Michael Williams’, that would seek to avoid relativism by appeal to reliability (p. 138).

It then seems fitting to focus on Kusch’s own understanding of normativity in terms of social norms. Perhaps the starkest formulation comes early: “What seems right to almost everyone—that is the collective ‘seems right’—is the most we can get in terms of an ‘is right’” (p. 98). To put it mildly, it is hard to see how this can be right. If the collective “seems right” is the most we can give to account for “is right,” then shouldn’t we declare that we have no account of normativity? To say otherwise reminds one of the famous characterization of the U.S. withdrawal from Vietnam—”Let’s just declare victory and go home.” While such a policy may make political sense, it is difficult to think that it makes for good philosophy.

It is noteworthy that others who look for social norms to ground normativity, Brandom, for example, would insist that the distinction between merely seeming right and being right must apply at the level of a community at a time. It must be possible for everyone in a community to agree on a point that is wrong. Brandom attempts to manage as well as motivate this distinction by pointing out that the commitments and entitlements undertaken by and accorded by members of a community envision a kind of correctability that will not allow correctness to be reduced to community consensus at a time. I am not at all convinced that Brandom’s solution is itself adequate, but I am convinced that he is right to demand more than Kusch is ready to provide.

A second misgiving has to do with Kusch’s accounts of semantics and truth. On a communitarian epistemology, both justification (or the rational constraints on beliefs) and knowledge are social statuses. But, of course, one does not have knowledge unless one’s belief is objectively correct—true. Accordingly, Kusch needs to provide a communitarian account of truth according to which it is also a social status. Thus, he advances parallel understandings of the standards for justified belief formation and the semantics for concepts: understandings according to which truth and meaning is wholly determined by a community’s consensual practices at a time. At any given time, the community will have a set of exemplars for the application of a given concept, and there will be some consensus regarding the similarity of various cases or entities with the exemplars. According to Kusch:

What makes an application of a word correct rather than incorrect is that one’s interlocutors let one get away with, or perhaps even praise, the way in which one judged the similarity between a shared exemplar and a newly encountered entity. Only others’ agreement can constitute correctness (204).

Applications, once accepted, can change the set of exemplars and inform the similarity judgments within the community. Accordingly, the exemplars and similarity bases for a concept can evolve. It follows from this “meaning finitism” that meanings change over time as the norms of the community shift. Further, what is agreed within the community at a time, what one can get away with and get others to follow, is correct, as it constitutes the semantics of the relevant concepts. What is agreed on is true. The extension of a concept or term changes with the decisions of the community—it is not fixed. Applied to the epistemic concept of justification, we get the result that, “the very meaning of ‘justified’ can—and does—change for a community as the array of exemplars changes” (155). What is true must change in a parallel fashion.

It is difficult to make this work. What of a consensus judgment of a community at some earlier time the denial of which seems to be the consensus judgment of folk today? Suppose the earlier community agreed that the motion of heavenly things is circular and unchanging and that anything farther away from the earth than the moon is a heavenly thing. I take it that, on Kusch’s account, these judgments must have been true. But, of course today we agree on judgments that readily would be expressed using the denials of the formulations just employed. So, these contemporary judgments are true as well? The belief of the ancients that heavenly motion is circular and unchanging and our belief that it is not are both true? Did the character of the motion of heavenly things change (from unchanging to changing)? Of course, one might say that meanings have changed—so that the above formulation in our language does not express what the earlier thinker’s were thinking. One might insist that they did not believe that heavenly motion was circular and unchanging—and that to attribute such a belief to them would be bad translation or interpretation. (There are those who have held this.) The problem is that most of us do not want to leave the matter there. Instead, we judge that some historical matters of consensus were incorrect, that subsequent investigation has corrected belief on the relevant matter. Kusch sometimes wants to agree: “judgments found correct at an earlier time might be reclassified as incorrect at a later time” (p. 207). But, on Kusch’s own account, would that not be a mistake? So, were the earlier thinkers incorrect in thinking that heavenly motion was circular and unchanging, or was it true then and not now, or did they not believe it (believing instead something not so translatable)? What gives?