Knowledge First?

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Aidan McGlynn, Knowledge First?, Palgrave Macmillan, 2014, 227pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137026453.

Reviewed by Krista Lawlor, Stanford University


According to its proponents, “knowledge-first” philosophy arises when we admit the failure of “traditional epistemology” to deliver promised goods. The diagnosis is that the traditional view fundamentally misconceives the nature of knowledge. The traditional view takes knowledge to be an alloy of more basic elements, e.g., belief, justification, truth. The knowledge-first view in contrast claims that knowledge is an “unexplained explainer”: (i) Knowledge is not an alloy at all, but its own thing. What sort of thing? Timothy Williamson, knowledge-first’s champion, claims that knowledge is a factive mental state, irreducible to belief; (ii) knowledge (or the concept of knowledge) plays an ineliminable role in the explanation of a range of important phenomena — assertion and practical reasoning, as well as justification, evidence, and belief — the very elements to which the traditional view gives explanatory or conceptual priority.

Aidan McGlynn’s stated aim is modest — he wants to tip the balance of argument back in favor of the traditional view. Still, the difficulty of his task is considerable. Knowledge-first arguments break out over widely spaced philosophical terrain, and the complexity of the issues is extremely demanding. McGlynn rises to the challenge admirably. He provides a well-written, opinionated survey.

Chapter 1 orients the reader with reminders about the basics of the Gettier problem for the traditional analysis of knowledge, and then isolates the main themes of the knowledge-first perspective, which comprise the topics for McGlynn’s chapters.

Chapter 2 concerns whether knowledge provides a standard for appropriate belief. McGlynn offers this interesting problem case. Jane holds a lottery ticket in a large, fair lottery whose winning number has been announced, although she hasn’t yet heard the announcement. In light of the odds, Jane believes hers is a losing ticket, takes this belief to be justified, and yet does not believe that she knows her ticket loses — she is, perhaps, convinced of the safety theory of knowledge and holds that the possibility that her ticket wins is “too close” for her belief to count as safe. The case suggests that it can be rational or reasonable to believe p (my ticket loses) while believing that one doesn’t know p. Even if Jane is wrong about safety theory being the correct theory of knowledge, McGlynn says, “it is not clear on what grounds we would regard her belief state as unreasonable or irrational” (27). Now Williamson of course holds that an impermissible belief may be reasonable if one reasonably but falsely believes it to satisfy the relevant normative requirements.1 But Jane’s case is not like that: she reasonably believes her belief to not satisfy the knowledge norm. With the case of Jane to soften us up, McGlynn proceeds to critique the arguments that are supposed to motivate the knowledge norm.

Chapters 3 and 4 examine knowledge-first approaches to justification and evidence. Chapter 3 begins with a quick recap of problems for Jonathan Sutton’s idea that to have a justified belief that p just is to know that p. The philosophical highlight of the chapter comes in discussion of Alexander Bird’s claim that justification is a matter of putting one in a position to know, or roughly, that one’s belief is justified only if there is some possible world in which a belief with the same basis is knowledgeable. McGlynn notes that Williamson himself in a different context offers a counterexample to Bird’s claim. Discussion here brings home to the reader that on occasion “the knowledge-first position” splinters into mutually inconsistent theses. It might have been helpful for McGlynn to devote more discussion to the relation between works by various knowledge-first philosophers and Williamson, since Williamson’s position is a touchstone for those of us who haven’t followed all the twists and turns of recent developments.

Chapter 4’s focus is Williamson’s E=K thesis, which makes two claims: (i) if a proposition is in one’s total evidence set, then it is known, and (ii) if a proposition is known, then it is in one’s total evidence set. It is worth going into detail about Williamson’s argument for (i). Williamson rests his claim on a case (call it Red Ball):

Suppose that balls are drawn from a bag, with replacement. In order to avoid issues about the present truth-values of statements about the future, assume that someone else has already made the draws; I watch them on film. For a suitable number n, the following situation can arise. I have seen draws 1 to n; each was red (produced a red ball). I have not yet seen draw n+1. I reason probabilistically, and form a justified belief that draw n+1 was red too. My belief is in fact true. But I do not know that draw n+1 was red.2

Next Williamson presents us with two hypotheses:

h: Draws 1 to n were red; draw n+1 is black.

h*: Draw 1 was black; draws 2 to n+1 were red.

He notes that it is natural to say that h is consistent with my evidence while h* is not. What explains this fact? The inconsistency of h* with my evidence is explained easily enough — I saw that draw 1 was red.3 What needs explaining is the consistency of h with my evidence. And to explain that, the key is to show why the proposition that n+1 is red is excluded from my evidence. Why is that?

Williamson’s own explanation for why the proposition that n+1 is red is excluded from my evidence makes use of his E=K thesis: “The obvious answer is that I do not know that draw n+1 was red; the unsatisfied necessary condition for evidence is knowledge.”4 If I don’t know that n+1 is red, then Williamson’s E=K thesis (i) will ensure that the proposition that n+1 is red is excluded from my evidence.

McGlynn’s criticism of Williamson’s argument is, first, that Williamson provides no argument for the claim that I do not know that n+1 is red. According to McGlynn Red Ball is a case of straightforward induction (54), so I do know that n+1 is red. McGlynn further notes that if this is so, not only does Williamson’s explanation of the facts fail, but more: what Williamson has provided us is a case where an item of knowledge is not in our evidence — which is a counterexample to his own claim (ii).

It seems to me that the question of knowledge in Red Ball is more vexed than either McGlynn or Williamson allow. It is not at all clear in the case as described, without further specification, that I knows or do not know that n+1 is red, on the basis of what I have seen. But let that be — the second criticism that McGlynn raises can be staged independently of his claim of knowledge. The criticism is simply that the traditional epistemologist has a natural alternative explanation of what excludes the proposition that n+1 is red from my evidence. If there is such a workable explanation, then Williamson will not have shown that we need his claim (i) to do the job. The traditionalist alternative that McGlynn explores is built on the claim that what belongs in my evidence is only non-inferential knowledge.5 Suppose that I do know that n+1 is red by inference; if so, then it is not part of my evidence.

The problem with the proposed restriction on evidence is that it is far too strong. In many cases, it is quite natural to suppose that my evidence includes propositions I know via inference. McGlynn notes that Alexander Bird argues along these very lines: if we restrict evidence to the non-inferential, there will be occasions involving forgotten observational evidence on which we cannot say anything plausible about how empirical conclusions are justified, other than by appeal to interim conclusions known by inference. I found McGlynn’s reply to Bird less than compelling, and surprisingly, McGlynn seems to admit the weakness of his position in a footnote (note 8, page 200). This makes it hard to accept McGlynn’s tally at the end: as he scores it, the knowledge-firster and the traditionalist stand at a draw, but as McGlynn actually leaves things, Williamson seems to have the only workable restriction on evidence in sight.

There is reason to think that McGlynn concludes discussion of the Red Ball case prematurely. How else might we explain our judgment that h is consistent with our evidence while h* isn’t? Here’s a thought that makes use of the natural notion of relativized evidence, i.e., evidence one has with respect to a given question.6 When Williamson notes about Red Ball that we find it “natural to say that h is consistent with my evidence and that h* is not” he invites us to use our commonsense judgment on the matter. And our judgment in such cases naturally invokes the idea of what can be evidence for what. So we process Williamson’s question: can that the next ball n+1 is red be part of my evidence for the conclusion that the next ball n+1 is red? Naturally not — that the next ball n+1 is red is the conclusion of my inference, and it would be question-begging to take a conclusion as evidence for itself. (Of course this is not to deny that there are possible cases of self-evidence; it is just to note that my evidence with respect to a given question does not routinely include its answer.)

Our intuitions about the Red Ball case are thus easily explained in terms of relativized evidence, and we don’t need Williamson’s restriction on total evidence to what is known in order to handle the data. Neither do we need the problematic alternative that McGlynn offers us. Should the reader wonder about use of the notion of relativized evidence in this dialectical setting, it is worth remembering that ordinary mortals need instruction in the idea of total evidence, and find it natural to think in terms of relativized evidence, or what is evidence for what. Since Williamson poses his case as one in which traditional epistemological thinking suffers an explanatory failure that the knowledge-first perspective alone can remedy, it wouldn’t be fair for him to disallow the traditionalist the tools at her disposal, where that includes our commonsense notion of relativized evidence.

Chapter 5 is a comparatively long one, surveying the main arguments in favor of the claim that knowledge is the “constitutive” norm of assertion (with only a little of the promised clarification regarding what the claim means). Many of the more familiar objections to the knowledge norm are considered, with emphasis on objections offering alternative norms. McGlynn finds arguments on both sides inconclusive: his diagnosis is both that the natural language use of epistemic terms (“knows”, “certain”) is messy, and that it is always a legitimate alternative hypothesis that the usage patterns that philosophers wield in their arguments are the product of communicative conventions or shortcuts and little more, signaling nothing very deep about our epistemic commitments in asserting. Throughout the chapter he displays good sense about both substantive and methodological issues surrounding the use of linguistic data. However, to me, the situation involving linguistic usage is not as grim as he presents it. And the philosophical tools we have at our disposal are more refined than McGlynn’s survey suggests.7

Whether knowledge is “the norm of action” is a very large topic; but McGlynn confines discussion in chapter 6 to arguments for a knowledge norm of action that parallel those for a knowledge norm of assertion. The last section highlights work on the question of possible connections between norms for action and assertion: do these norms derive from a single norm? McGlynn’s discussion is compact, but gives a good sense of the terrain.

Chapters 7 and 8 (Part II) concern Williamson’s thesis that knowledge is a mental state. How can knowledge be a mental state? The imagined challenger argues it cannot be: it seems implausible that whenever I know something, I also know that I know it, but it seems plausible that I readily know other of my mental states when I have them. Williamson’s much discussed “anti-luminosity” argument is an effort to reply to this imagined challenge, by showing that even the most compelling candidates for self-knowledge fail to be luminous mental states. So it’s no surprise if knowledge is both a mental state but also fails to be luminous. In chapter 7 McGlynn goes into deep detail about the arguments for and against Williamson’s anti-luminosity argument, and finds that despite a great deal of energy expended by challengers, Williamson’s argument survives. McGlynn reminds us, however, that in order to challenge Williamson all one needs is some epistemic feature or other that mental states possess but knowledge does not. He claims that Selim Berker identifies one such a feature, “lustrousness”: a mental state is lustrous, roughly speaking, if when you’re in the state, you’re in a position to justifiably believe you are. But to me it seems Williamson has a clear reply, and that is to question whether the lustrous mental states include attitudes, or whether lustrous states are all and only sensory (not attitudinal) states. If only the latter, then Williamson can insist that lustrousness is hardly a mark of the mental as such. (It is somewhat perplexing that McGlynn in chapter 8 seems to briefly acknowledge the availability of something like this reply, but only after scoring the tally in chapter 7 against the knowledge-firster.)

Chapter 8 takes on Williamson’s contention that knowledge is a wholly mental factive state. McGlynn does a nice job separating out what is contentious and uncontentious about this claim. Knowledge might be agreed on all sides to be more than a mere conjunction of mental and non-mental components — that is, even the traditionalist who thinks of knowledge as an “alloy” of mental and non-mental elements will agree that the mental component (belief) must be connected in a non-trivial way with the non-mental (truth, justification). What is contentious is whether “knowing adds nothing mental to believing”, as the tradition has it, or whether Williamson is correct that knowing is a mental state distinct from believing. McGlynn carefully unpacks Williamson’s attack on the traditional view, suggesting an improved argument for Williamson, but he ultimately concludes that Williamson’s attack on the tradition is unsuccessful. Arguments here bring in considerations from all over the map — developmental psychology, cognitive psychology, semantic externalism, action theory and philosophical psychology. Just giving readers a lay of the land here is an expository feat.

This brief summary will, I hope, give a sense of both the large scope and careful detailed work in this fine book. In assessing the knowledge-first program, McGlynn has taken on a Herculean task. It seems mean spirited to ask for more. Nonetheless, after grappling with the range of arguments presented, a reader can be forgiven for thinking the traditionalist does need something more, and of a different kind. One wonders if the traditional view is best defended by a “survey and tally” strategy. We can safely expect that the tally of arguments won and lost will swing back and forth — and it’s a fiction that we could ever feel we had a final tally. Moreover, experienced readers will recognize a general rule in philosophy, that when many arguments for and against stack up around a thesis, it can seemingly survive, simply because so much is said about it.

For these reasons, those who wish to defend the traditional perspective might seek something different. One possibility is some global coherence checks on the knowledge-first program. For instance, Williamson favors a strong analogy between knowledge and action, and suggests that it provides the deep rationale for the knowledge-first program. How compelling is this analogy? (If belief can only be understood in terms of knowledge, then can desire only be understood in terms of intention or action?) Perhaps the thing that will ultimately bring epistemology to a more stable traditional perspective is simple assimilation. The traditionalist might take various knowledge-first challenges as occasions to broaden her perspective. On the question of explanatory priority, for instance, the traditionalist can explore the ways in which knowledge has its own explanatory roles to play. There can be little doubt that the concept of knowledge plays an ineliminable role in explanation of social aspects of inquiry.8 And perhaps knowledge is the norm of assurance while true belief the norm of assertion? A greater pluralism about explanatory tools will make traditional epistemology savvier. After the traditional view assimilates what it can, the knowledge-first program will own a distinct remainder. The committed knowledge-firster will insist that central concepts must be explained in terms of knowledge. The savvy traditionalist will take odds that we will need a wide stock of possibly mutually explained explainers (belief, justification, evidence, and knowledge among others) because there certainly is plenty to explain, more than enough to go around.

1 Timothy Williamson, Knowledge and Its Limits (Oxford University Press, 2000), p. 256. It’s not clear how McGlynn might handle another response open to Williamson, to the effect that Jane is simply in no position to have the full out belief my ticket loses, although she might permissibly full out believe that it’s probable my ticket loses (ibid).

2 ibid, p. 200.

3 Williamson allows that one might say that one saw or observed that draw 1 was black, and that answer would suffice for the case at hand; however, he argues that this answer won’t do for all purposes (p. 202ff), so we should prefer the answer that h* is inconsistent because one knows that draw 1 was black.

4 ibid. p 201.

5 McGlynn cites as proponents of this restriction Alvin Goldman, “Williamson on Knowledge and Evidence,” in Williamson on Knowledge (Oxford University Press, 2009); James M. Joyce, “Williamson on Knowledge and Evidence,” Philosophical Books 45 (2004): 296-305. Note that the restriction applies mutatis mutandis if we want to hold that one merely has justified true belief that n+1 is red.

6 Thanks to David Hills for this suggestion.

7 For instance, the chapter omits important objections to the knowledge-norm of assertion owing to Bernard Williams, Truth and Truthfulness: An Essay in Genealogy (Princeton University Press, 2004); Judith Jarvis Thomson, Normativity (Open Court, 2008). For a more optimistic take on what usage can tell us, see Lawlor, “Précis of Assurance” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research90, no. 1 (2015): 194-204.

8 See, for instance, Edward Craig, Knowledge and the State of Nature: An Essay in Conceptual Synthesis (Oxford University Press, 1999).