Knowledge from Non-Knowledge: Inference, Testimony and Memory

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Federico Luzzi, Knowledge from Non-Knowledge: Inference, Testimony and Memory, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 198pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108491914.

Reviewed by Claudio de Almeida, PUCRS (Brazil), and J.R. Fett, UFSM (Brazil)


For good reason, we have come to expect first-rate philosophy from publisher Cambridge University Press. And, yet, even for high-prestige publishers, most of us feel we can use reviewers for reassurance. The more fastidious those reviewers are, the more potentially helpful they are. That, of course, is because most of us know that a whole lot can go wrong in 200+ pages of philosophy, even in pages penned by the best authors in the field. In Federico Luzzi's case, these two fastidious reviewers offer a bit of both: we get confirmation of first-rate philosophical work, and we also get to know how some of what can go wrong does go wrong.

Luzzi's book grew out of five recent papers by him that deal with one of the most exciting themes in contemporary epistemology: the apparent fact that knowledge can arise from ignorance ('knowledge from non-knowledge', or 'KF~K', for short), by either inference, or testimony, or memory, in a way that is not familiar from the literature on epistemological foundationalism (where, at least since Aristotle, we find the very popular, if controversial, claim that not all knowledge can be inferential). While the fact has been acknowledged by a (growing) number of philosophers who write on those 'sources' of knowledge, Luzzi is the first to give us a monograph on the relevant phenomena in the epistemology of inference specifically. But his project is one of identifying a KF~K theme, by tackling the other KF~K phenomena as well, those in the epistemologies of testimony and memory. Is there an overarching, unifying lesson to be gathered by looking at the KF~K phenomena in the various domains, beyond the generic (and superficial) KF~K claim? Or is the focus on a KF~K theme just a marketing ploy where no unifying lesson can be expected? Although Luzzi's project naturally invites this kind of question, we, frankly, don't much care about an unfavorable answer, if some such answer is forthcoming. To us, what most clearly emerges is that this is a very skillful author who has insightfully contributed to the three areas in epistemology, even if a deep lesson involving KF~K in the three areas should remain elusive. And we'll drop a spoiler right here: In his short final chapter 7, where Luzzi tries to find that deep, unifying lesson concerning KF~K, he comes very close to admitting that no such lesson can be found. It remains, in any case, that he has efficiently paved the way for further exploration of the KF~K results.

The heart of Luzzi's book is his work on the idea that inferential knowledge can arise from belief in premises that are cases of ignorance. The impetus here mainly comes from cases of apparent knowledge-from-falsehood (or 'KFF' cases). Accepting that there are genuine KFF cases, as Luzzi does, puts you on a collision course with the Aristotelian tradition as regards the account of inferential knowledge, the knowledge-from-knowledge (or 'KFK') tradition, according to which only knowledge begets knowledge in reasoning of any kind. (Aristotle speaks of knowledge by deduction exclusively, but the idea has been generalized since then.) In previous work, Luzzi (2014: 261) introduced his anti-KFK case in response to the following principle, labeled 'Knowledge Counter-Closure':

'(KCC): Necessarily, if (i) S comes to believe q solely on the basis of competent deduction from her belief that p and (ii) S knows q, then S knows p.'

The label 'KCC' aims at suggesting that this is 'a sister principle to [Knowledge] Closure' (Luzzi 2010: 673):

KC: 'Necessarily, if (i) S knows p, (ii) S knows that p entails q, and (iii) S comes to believe q solely on the basis of competently deducing it from p, then S knows q'

If we replace clause (ii) in Luzzi's 2010 formulation of KC with the weaker condition requiring only that p entail q, we are enjoined to understand that Luzzi's target is the left-to-right conditional in what we may call 'the biconditional view' of knowledge by deduction: S knows that q by valid deduction from premise p iff S knows that p and believes that q solely by validly deducing it from p. There is a vast literature on the possible falsehood of the right-to-left conditional in the biconditional view. KFF-ers, such as Luzzi, hold that the left-to-right conditional is false. They are opposed by the conservative KDF-ers, those for whom purported cases of KFF turn out to be, on close inspection, cases of knowledge-despite-falsehood. (KDF-ers include all KFK-ers for whom some cases of inferential knowledge include false-but-evidentially-inessential premises. We don't know of any KFK-er who is not a KDF-er.) The reader won't find a theory of the KFF phenomenon in Luzzi's book, not a complete theory anyway. For KFF-ers, any such theory would require making what one of us (de Almeida 2017) has characterized as the 'benign/malignant' distinction for false premises, that is, the distinction between knowledge-yielding and knowledge-suppressing falsehoods in reasoning. In the section of his book that deals with the epistemology of inference, Luzzi's aim is simply to show that KCC is a false principle, one the jettisoning of which, according to him, comes at a surprisingly low philosophical cost. And we think that he is, for the most part, razor-sharp in the pursuit of his goal.

We now turn to a number of warnings concerning some of the book's technical flaws, those that we feel can be accommodated in the available space.

When you are the first on the market with a monograph on an exciting topic, the first question on your readers' minds may be the one concerning the quality of your book's scholarship on two fronts: references and factual accuracy. Is the book well-informed by its sources? And is it fair to those sources? Our answer to both questions is 'not very.'

Maybe the rush to publish took its toll on Luzzi's bibliography. Whatever the cause, the omissions on that front are alarming. Notice: as regards the epistemology of reasoning, the KFF/KDF problem is a nascent topic with fewer than thirty specific high-profile sources since Risto Hilpinen gave us his 1988 landmark contribution. We'd naturally expect to see reference to all of the noteworthy sources that were available before the publication of Christopher Buford and Christopher Cloos' 2018 paper, the latest entry in Luzzi's bibliography, with titles closest to that cut-off date naturally receiving less attention. But some of the major pre-2018 entries have been ignored. As far as we've been able to determine, they include all of the following, in whose work we find discussion specifically aimed at Luzzi's problem: Fred Adams, John Barker, and Murray Clarke (2017), Robert Audi (2003, 2011), Rodrigo Borges (2017), John Hawthorne and Dani Rabinowitz (2017), Peter Klein (1996, 2017), Adam Leite (2013), and Clayton Littlejohn (2013, 2016). (Due to space constraints, only titles not in Luzzi's bibliography are displayed in our reference section below.)

An even more pressing concern involves Luzzi's history of his topic. According to one of his main sources, Branden Fitelson (2017: 316, fn. 7; erroneously dated '2016' by Luzzi), after Hilpinen sounded the alarm about KFF cases, 'it wasn't until Ted Warfield's paper (2005) seventeen years later that such examples were taken up as serious challenges [to KFK].' Luzzi simply repeats what he's found in Fitelson's 2017 paper. But both have missed a lot of history. Warfield's 2005 paper was, indeed, the first major publication on the issue after Hilpinen attacked KFK. But there is seemingly incontrovertible evidence that Warfield did not initiate the discussion of KFF after Hilpinen. In a note, after acknowledging comments by Audi, Warfield (2005: 416, n. 17) writes: 'Discussions with Coffman, who commented at a conference on related work from Claudio de Almeida and Peter Klein, informed me that others were working on this topic . . . ' Unfortunately, Warfield hasn't told us when those informative discussions with E.J. Coffman took place.

But here's a brief report on the relevant facts. In the second, 2003 edition of his book Epistemology, Audi (p. 213, n. 4) reports that he learned about the KFF problem from a draft of an unpublished paper by one of us, de Almeida, who discussed a theory of apparent KFF cases that Klein was preparing for publication. Luzzi missed Audi's 2003 note, just as he ignored Audi's new, 2011 note on the issue for the third edition of that book (Audi 2011: 237; dated '2010' by Luzzi, possibly an early print run, according to Audi). Klein's theory was first aired at a 1999 PUCRS talk in Brazil, hosted by de Almeida. Klein reports on that first airing in his 2008 paper (p. 25). Luzzi apparently wasn’t familiar with the report in Klein's paper. The paper by de Almeida mentioned by Audi (2003) became an October 2003 talk at a Chicago meeting of the Central States Philosophical Association in which de Almeida discussed Klein's theory of purported KFF cases and put forward an alternative proposal. That proposal was, in turn, explicitly criticized in Klein's 2008 paper (with the relevant dates mentioned).

Coffman was the commentator for de Almeida's session at the CSPA meeting. He was then a PhD candidate, with Alvin Plantinga and Warfield as his supervisors. It's a safe bet that Warfield's relevant discussions with Coffman were well under way by October 2003. Both Luzzi and Fitelson mention Coffman's 2008 paper (which was partially on KFF). And, yet, they both ignore Coffman's (very prominent) reference to a then-new KFF case in Klein's 1996 review of Plantinga's epistemology (Klein 1996: 106), where it's offered as an important objection to Plantinga. In October 2004, Jonathan Kvanvig started the first of four 2004 threads (three by him, one by de Almeida) in his blog Certain Doubts, where what turned out to be Klein's 2008 theory was discussed in detail by a number of bloggers, including Warfield. Isn't that serious-enough attention to the problem before Warfield gave us his paper? None of this takes anything away from the impact that Warfield's 2005 paper had on the KFF-related literature. It just sets the record straight with regard to Klein's leading role in this topic. Luzzi had easy access to all of these pieces of information. And, yet, on Luzzi's history of the KFF/KDF issue, Klein is portrayed as the latecomer who 'also proposed and discussed similar [KFF] cases' (p. 8, n. 1, emphasis added). So, we have to rely on reviewers for this: After Hilpinen's brief remarks on KFF failed to generate discussion, there is no reason to think that there would have been a KFF problem if it weren't for Klein's insightful lead. We all are in his debt for this topic.

On the textual front, we must report on two problems that affect intelligibility.

Luzzi has kept his 2010 title, 'Knowledge Counter-Closure', for his main target, but he feels (pp. 5-6) that the label might suggest opposition to KC. He explains that he means to identify what we have called 'the left-to-right conditional in the biconditional view' of knowledge by deduction. Might the label 'converse closure' have been more perspicuous? In any case, this bit of terminological discomfort belongs to the stipulative aspect of his terminology and is easily disposed of when he clarifies what is meant. But there is a more pressing issue on this front.

Luzzi (p. 5) reconsiders his earlier formulation of KCC. The new target is as follows:

KCC (2019 version): 'Necessarily, if (i) S believes q solely on the basis of competent inference from p, and (ii) S knows q, then S knows p.'

Notice that, now, the principle ranges over any case of 'competent inference.' It is no longer a principle of knowledge by deduction. But, now, the conceptual connection with the biconditional view is severed. The label 'Knowledge Counter-Closure' has become downright misleading, since knowledge is not closed under non-deductive (i.e., ampliative) inference. So, has 'Knowledge Counter-Closure' simply become a label for the view that only from knowledge can inferential knowledge (in general) arise? That's how it looks on p. 5. But, on p. 7, where he gives us 'a schema for KCC failures,' Luzzi gives us this necessary condition on KCC failure: 'S believes [the conclusion] that q on no basis other than competent deductive inference from p.' We were ready to dismiss the reversal to the 2014 version of KCC as a simple rush-to-publish error when, again, on p. 32, the very same confusing clause in the schema for KCC failures is repeated. And, on pp. 50-1 and 63, it gets even more confusing. There, the schemata require both 'competent inference' and 'competent deductive inference.' But we nearly wrecked our brains trying to understand why the schemata for KCC failures should require both 'competent inference' and 'competent deductive inference.' And then we just stopped trying. So, we can only speculate that this is a case of rush-to-publish turned mad-dash-to-the-press. (The hypothesis is consistent with the fairly large number of typos we've found.) Then, in section 4.5.1, Luzzi does explicitly revert to the 2014 version of KCC, the one restricted to deduction, and notes (on p. 111, fn. 14) that, 'for the purposes of this section,' his use of the label 'KCC' does involve a 'slight inaccuracy,' one that he deems 'harmless in this context.' But what should we think about the ambiguity in previous sections? We have the persistent impression that he is, for the most part, thinking of KCC as the view that only knowledge begets knowledge in reasoning of any kind, but, frustratingly, we can't be sure of it.

We trust that the above warnings are helpful to readers, but we definitely do not mean to suggest that Luzzi is in any way exceptional, as a writer who may have bowed to the pressure to cut corners, in today's philosophy market, if that is what explains the anomalies we're describing. The problem is insidious and widespread in the community.

But here's the good news: Only a few of Luzzi's arguments meet with resistance from us, the reviewers, and none of the arguments is clearly fallacious. Luzzi's book is tightly argued, very well-written, and exciting from beginning to end. His arguments contain a sizeable amount of first-rate philosophy. Some of what we find easiest to like comes from sections 3.5-8, where Luzzi persuasively argues that there is no refuge for KCC in either Keith DeRose's contextualism or Jason Stanley's pragmatic-encroachment view (marketed by Stanley as a new form of invariantism). Highlights also include the argument (especially in section 3.9, with relevant material in sections 3.2-4) according to which KFF-ers who rely on key claims by modal epistemologies should expect to find cases of knowledge based on Gettierized belief. (Like many, Luzzi speaks of 'Gettiered' belief, but there may be infelicitous morphology here, since he feels that he must use 'Gettierization' (p. 29), rather than 'Gettieration', when he needs the noun.) And there is more insightful material in chapter 4, especially in the set of objections to some of Peter Murphy's arguments.

In chapters 5 and 6, on testimonial knowledge and on memorial knowledge respectively, Luzzi remains an insightful commentator in much more familiar territory. There, he mainly aims at adding to Jennifer Lackey's case for KF~K, but her groundbreaking work in those areas is also occasionally targeted by persuasive criticism. For instance, we think that the material in section 5.5.2, where Luzzi argues, contra Lackey, that 'testimonial knowledge from unsafe belief is possible' (p. 160), is a superb contribution to the debate. Another highlight in those chapters is his critique of some of Elizabeth Fricker's claims in the epistemology of testimony (section 5.4).

Most of Luzzi's book (the first four chapters) is a must-read source on this nascent problem for the epistemology of reasoning: the case against KFK. And where the novelty factor is absent, in the chapters on the epistemologies of testimony and memory, we still find important contributions to the more familiar case for KF~K.


We thank Robert Audi and the Editor, Anastasia Gutting, for helpful comments on a draft of this review.


Adams, F., Barker, J.A., and Clarke, M. (2017). Knowledge as Fact-Tracking True Belief. Manuscrito 40(4), 1-30.

Audi, R. (2003). Epistemology: A Contemporary Introduction to the Theory of Knowledge, Second Edition. London: Routledge.

Borges, R. (2017). Inferential Knowledge and the Gettier Conjecture. In R. Borges, C. de Almeida, and P.D. Klein (Eds.), Explaining Knowledge: New Essays on the Gettier Problem (pp. 273-91). Oxford: Oxford University Press.

De Almeida, C. (2017). Knowledge, Benign Falsehoods, and the Gettier Problem. In R. Borges, C. de Almeida, and P.D. Klein (Eds.), Explaining Knowledge: New Essays on the Gettier Problem (pp. 292-311). Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Hawthorne, J. and Rabinowitz, D. (2017). Knowledge and False Belief. In R. Borges, C. de Almeida, and P.D. Klein (Eds.), Explaining Knowledge: New Essays on the Gettier Problem (pp. 325-44). Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Klein, P.D. (2017). The Nature of Knowledge. In R. Borges, C. de Almeida, and P.D. Klein (Eds.), Explaining Knowledge: New Essays on the Gettier Problem (pp. 35-56). Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Klein, P.D. (1996). Warrant, Proper Function, Reliabilism, and Defeasibility. In J. Kvanvig (Ed.), Warrant in Contemporary Epistemology: Essay's in Honor of Plantinga's Theory of Knowledge (pp. 97-130). Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.

Kvanvig, J. (2004). Klein on Useful Falsehoods. Certain Doubts.

Leite, A. (2013). 'But That's not Evidence; It's not Even True!' Philosophical Quarterly 63: 81-104.

Littlejohn, C. (2016). Learning from Learning from Our Mistakes. In P. Schemechtig and M. Grajner (Eds.), Epistemic Reasons, Norms and Goals (pp. 51-70). Berlin: De Gruyter.

Littlejohn, C. (2013). No Evidence is False. Acta Analytica 28: 145-59.