Knowledge in an Uncertain World

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Jeremy Fantl and Matt McGrath, Knowledge in an Uncertain World, Oxford UP, 2009, 251pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199550623.

Reviewed by Clayton Littlejohn, University of Texas at San Antonio



It was the best of books. It was the worst of books. Best because it was filled with interesting and original arguments about the nature and possibility of knowledge. Worst because the arguments were good, much better than I had hoped given that they were arguments against an attractive constellation of views. Many of us aren’t skeptics and are fallibilists. Many of us never suspected that there was a pragmatic dimension to knowledge. We were enquiring minds and we wanted to know. The epistemologists were supposed to tell us what it takes to have knowledge and it wasn’t any of their business why we wanted to know or what we wanted to do with our knowledge. Fantl and McGrath will try to convince you that this cannot all be right and force you to choose between an infallibilist view that seems to make skepticism irresistible and a fallibilist view that might avoid skepticism, but only by allowing for pragmatic encroachment. On the view they prefer, if it matters more to me whether p than it does to you, it can be harder for me to know if p is true than it is for you. Even if we have the same evidence and the same attitudes, so that our epistemic positions with respect to p are equally strong, you might be in a position to know things I am not. Before getting into the overview, let me say that working through the puzzles having to do with the relations between knowledge, justification, and reasons for belief and action has been a great deal of fun. I cannot recall enjoying a book as much as I’ve enjoyed Knowledge in an Uncertain World. I do have some reservations about their impurist view and their arguments for it. Luckily, since so much turns on whether they’re right, if they’re right, I might never have to concede to them that I know they are.

Let’s start with an overview. Fallibilists say that it’s possible for you to know p even if there is some non-zero chance (for you) that ~p. Lewis thought that fallibilism was mad. On this view the statement, ‘I know that p, but it might be that ~p’ could express a true proposition. The statement seems to be an overt statement of the fallibilist view and it seems contradictory. Fantl and McGrath think we can explain why the statement seems contradictory in Gricean terms: when you say ‘It might be that ~p’, you pragmatically imply that there is a significant possibility of error.1 While significant chances of error threaten knowledge, not every chance of error is significant. Once we start distinguishing the significant chances of error that threaten knowledge from those that are harmless, it would be nice if we had something to say about this distinction. Fantl and McGrath think that one advantage that their impurist view has is that they can say something about the distinction: knowing p requires only that p is probable enough for you properly to put p to work as a basis for belief and action (25).

In Chapter 2, they discuss some examples that suggest that our willingness to say someone ‘knows’ a proposition, p, depends upon p‘s practical significance. The question is whether these cases and our responses to them tell us something about ’knowledge’ or knowledge. Consider DeRose’s bank cases:

Bank Case A. My wife and I are driving home on a Friday afternoon. We plan to stop at the bank on the way home to deposit our paychecks. But as we drive past the bank, we notice that the lines inside are very long, as they often are on Friday afternoons. Although we generally like to deposit our paychecks as soon as possible, it is not especially important in this case that they be deposited right away, so I suggest that we drive straight home and deposit our paychecks on Saturday morning. My wife says, ‘Maybe the bank won’t be open tomorrow. Lots of banks are closed on Saturdays.’ I reply, ‘No, I know it’ll be open. I was just there two weeks ago on Saturday. It’s open until noon.‘

Bank Case B. My wife and I drive past the bank on a Friday afternoon, as in Case A, and notice the long lines. I again suggest that we deposit our paychecks on Saturday morning, explaining that I was at the bank on Saturday morning only two weeks ago and discovered that it was open until noon. But in this case, we have just written a very large and important check. If our paychecks are not deposited into our checking account before Monday morning, the important check we wrote will bounce, leaving us in a very bad situation. And, of course, the bank is not open on Sunday. My wife reminds me of these facts. She then says, ’Banks do change their hours. Do you know the bank will be open tomorrow?’ Remaining as confident as I was before that the bank will be open then, still, I reply, ‘Well, no. I’d better go in and make sure.’ (DeRose (1992: 913)).

A contextualist could argue that the best explanation as to why it seems that both speakers speak the truth in these cases is that ‘knows’ picks out different relations in these two cases. Fantl and McGrath try to show how an invariantist (i.e., someone who thinks that the semantic value of ‘knows’ does not depend upon features of the conversational context (e.g., the salience of skeptical hypotheses, the stakes) can accommodate the data by appeal to the following principle:

Action: If you know p, it is proper for you to act on p in deciding what to do (49).

Since what’s proper for you to treat as a reason in these cases differ (i.e., it’s proper to treat that the bank will be open as a reason for action in the low stakes case but not the high), Action tells us that what’s known will differ and we don’t need to assume that ‘knows’, on our lips, picks out different relations when we describe cases where the practical stakes differ.

In Chapters 3 and 4, Fantl and McGrath extend their argument against knowledge and justification purism by first arguing for KJ:

KJ: If you know p, p is warranted enough to justify you in Φ-ing, for any Φ.2

Armed with KJ, we can attack the fallibilist purist view by pointing to pairs of cases where subjects in these cases have equally strong epistemic positions with respect to p where we can make it intuitive to say that only one subject is warranted in treating p as a reason for action by raising the practical stakes in one of the cases. For example, we might imagine Matt wants to take the express simply because he thinks the local is a minor inconvenience. We might think that if he overhears someone say that this train is the express, we might be prepared to say that it is okay for him to treat that this train is the express as a reason for boarding. If Jeremy wants to take the express because he knows that if he misses the express and ends up on the local, he will not get his payment in to his bookie on time and will lose a finger, we probably would think that he should check to make sure this really is the train he needs. That he is not warranted in treating that this train is the express as a reason for boarding suggests Matt knows something he does not until he investigates further.

To defend the impurist view of justification, Fantl and McGrath argue that the warrant that knowledge provides is not lost if the proposition believed is false or the belief is Gettiered provided that the justification is held fixed. They then argue that we have sufficient justification for believing iff we have knowledge-level justification for believing. This is supposed to justify the transition from KJ to JJ:

JJ: If you are justified in believing p, p is warranted enough to justify you in Φ-ing, for any Φ.

There is a potential problem with their argument for an impurist view of knowledge and justification. It might be possible for someone to say that the truth conditions for ascriptions of knowledge and justified belief depend, in part, upon the practical significance of p for the subject because the practical significance of p is part of what determines whether the subject believes p. In Chapter 5, they grant that belief might have a pragmatic dimension in the sense that believing p requires that your credence in p is sufficiently high for p to be your motivating reason for you to Φ for some connected Φ. They do not think that this weak pragmatist view of belief undercuts the case for impurism about knowledge and justification.

In Chapter 6, Fantl and McGrath discuss the value and importance of knowledge. They are skeptical of the idea that our interest in knowledge might be due to the fact that we take knowledge to be always prima facie valuable. Instead, the importance of knowledge is that it figures in useful philosophical principles. They reject Williamson’s suggestion that knowledge is what warrants assertion. For them, the concept of knowledge plays an essential role in a fallibilist account of justified belief and the warranted use of justifying reasons for action. To justifiably believe p requires not just some justification, but knowledge-level justification.

In Chapter 7, Fantl and McGrath take up the question as to whether we should prefer an infallibilist purist view or a fallibilist impurist view. KJ, they say, shows that fallibilist purism is false. They think fallibilist impurism is the better of the two views. It seems that the infallibilist purist view leads to skepticism. On this view, we can only know humdrum truths (e.g., here’s a hand, Texas is not on the moon, Al Gore is not a horse) if the epistemic probability of these truths for you is 1. Since it’s obviously irrational to put up something of trivial value against your life in betting on these truths, the infallibilist has to concede that these are not known.

The book contains two appendixes. In the first, Fantl and McGrath explain that we do not need to choose between KJ and Bayesian decision theory. In the second, they address the worry that KJ commits them to infallibilism. If it did, they could not use KJ to motivate fallibilist impurism. They argue that infallibilism is not a consequence of KJ.

Critical Evaluation

(i) Knowledge

An initial complaint Fantl and McGrath lodge against fallibilism is that the fallibilist makes a distinction between significant and insignificant possibilities of error. The distinction is supposed to help us see how it could be that someone could know even if there is some chance that they are wrong. The problem is that the purist fallibilist has no good answer to the question, ‘How probable must p be to be known?’ (25). They suggest that the fallibilist should put knowledge to work — the possibility of error is not significant if you can properly put p to work as a reason for action or belief. I don’t see how we could possibly answer the question ‘How probable must p be to be put to work?’ without opting for views they don’t like (e.g., if p is absolutely certain). So, I don’t think the real problem with purist fallibilism is that it’s less informative than impurist fallibilism. The real problem for purist fallibilism is how it handles high/low stakes cases. You can argue against fallibilist purism directly by appeal to intuitions about knowledge ascription and denial or indirectly by appeal to KJ and the observation that whether we are warranted in treating p as a reason for action will depend, in part, upon the practical significance of p.

It’s difficult to evaluate the direct attack against fallibilist purism. Assume that in Bank Case B the speaker speaks properly in saying ‘I don’t know’. Even if we assume that propriety is a good guide to correctness, you might think that subjects that take themselves not to know will, normally, not have the belief in the proposition they take themselves not to know. (Subjects that believe p while believing themselves not to know p suffer from a kind of madness that makes Moore’s Paradox so interesting.) Without a belief, there’s no knowledge, but the explanation as to why there’s no knowledge in the high stakes case makes no use of the hypothesis that (crudely put) it is harder to know when the stakes are high than it is to know when they are low. To deal with this sort of worry, Fantl and McGrath suggest we can stipulate that the subject in Bank Case B has the belief that the bank will be open but think that if the subject said that he knew that the bank would be open, he would speak falsely. I have to confess that I don’t share this intuition. I’m not saying that I find their claim counterintuitive, only that I’m not moved to accept it or deny it. If the speaker said ‘I know’, I would not object. As we fill in more and more of the details to block purist fallibilist explanations as to why subjects in high stakes cases lack knowledge or error theories that explain why subjects speak as if this is so, the intuitions that I’d have to have to be moved by the direct attack on purist fallibilism start to wane.

The worry isn’t just that once all the potential wrinkles in the direct attack on purist fallibilism are ironed out I don’t have the intuition that subjects in high stakes cases speak falsely when they say they claim to know what Fantl and McGrath say they don’t. Further, I find the impurist fallibilist’s claims positively counterintuitive. Consider:

You: Have you seen Audrey?

Me: No, I haven’t. Have you asked Ben?

You: You think he might know where she is?

Me: I guess that depends. He probably knows if you just wanted to go get coffee with her, but it’s less likely he knows if you need to know where she is to save her from ninjas.

I don’t think the last remark could be in good order. Suppose, however, that I know that you and Ben both know why you need to find Audrey and so know you two know whether this is a high or low stakes case. I can’t see how the impurist could say that these remarks must be out of order, so if we’re just pitting intuition against intuition, I’m not yet convinced that the impurist enjoys a clear advantage over the purist when it comes to knowledge attributions and denials.3

The indirect argument against purist fallibilism can help shoulder the burden. To save the impurist fallibilist view of knowledge, we either have to deny KJ or deny that changes in the stakes can change what level of justification is needed to have sufficient warrant to treat something as the basis for action. In defense of purist fallibilism, someone might target KJ. According to KJ, if p is known, it is proper for you to put p to work in reasoning about what to do. Suppose p is some mundane proposition we think we’re in a good position to know on the basis of fallible grounds, g. Suppose you’re forced to bet on whether q is true. You know q is a logical consequence of p and not a logical consequence of g. If the gain to be had for betting on q is low enough and the loss you’d incur if ~q is great enough, it seems that the rational person’s betting preferences might be determined by g, but not p. (Conditional on p, the rational thing to do is bet on q and then collect your tiny winnings. Conditional on g, the rational thing is to avoid the risk of a major loss for a nearly trivial gain.) If it’s not rational to treat p as a reason in this case (which it isn’t), KJ seems to imply that p really isn’t known.

Fantl and McGrath’s response is clever (226). They think they can respond to this argument against KJ, a version of the argument from hypothetical gambles, in roughly the way that Sorensen (1988) responds to Kripke’s dogmatism paradox. Suppose you know p. You know, then, that if any evidence against p surfaces, it is misleading. So, can you properly disregard any evidence against p if any surfaces? It seems not. Sorensen’s suggestion: when the evidence against p surfaces, you lose your knowledge of p and your basis for accepting the conditional that if any evidence against p emerges it is misleading (the conditional is ‘junk knowledge’). So, you can’t properly disregard the evidence, but that’s not because you don’t know p in situations where the evidence against it hasn’t surfaced. Applied to hypothetical gambles, KJ says that if p is known, it can be put to work, and that seems to justify a policy of betting as if p rather than just betting as if g. However, to say that p is known now, it doesn’t follow that the knowledge is retained in a betting situation. If you know p, you know the conditional: if offered the appropriate gamble, it would be best to take it. However, your knowledge of the conditional is junk knowledge. If you know p, you do know the conditional, but knowledge of that conditional does not justify the conditional preference that would lead to reckless betting behavior. In being offered the bet, Fantl and McGrath say, you lose the knowledge that p and so lose whatever justification you had for adopting a reckless betting policy premised on p rather than g. For this response to work, we have to think that changing the stakes is the sort of thing that leads to a loss of knowledge. Here the dialectic gets complicated. The threat that evidence against p poses to knowledge that p is obvious. Is raising the stakes, like introducing new evidence, a threat to knowledge? If you thought that KJ and impurism about knowledge were antecedently well motivated, this might be a satisfying response. If you were not already committed to KJ and impurism, the response is less satisfying.

(ii) Epistemic and Practical Justification

In the course of arguing from impurism about knowledge to impurism about justification, Fantl and McGrath argue that we don’t need to know p to have sufficient warrant to treat p as a reason for action or belief; we only need knowledge-level justification. According to KJ, if you know p, p is warranted enough to justify belief and action. Holding fixed knowledge-level justification and subtracting truth and being unGettiered from knowledge makes no difference as to whether p is warranted enough to justify belief and action. Thus JJ is true: if p is knowledge-level justified (or, simply, justified), p is warranted enough to justify. The view deviates from a view defended by Hawthorne and Stanley on which knowledge is needed to properly treat something as a reason.

I think Fantl and McGrath are right that the Gettier conditions don’t matter, but what about the truth-requirement? If you accept JJ on the basis of the subtraction argument, you have to say that falsehoods can justify. Coop orders two gin and tonics, one for Audrey and one for himself. He’s given one gin and tonic and one petrol and tonic. He hands Audrey the petrol and tonic. She drinks. She becomes violently ill. This date is not going well. While Coop might have nearly killed Audrey, can he justify giving her the toxic stuff? He can try, of course, but can he succeed? Here’s what Fantl and McGrath say:

Notice if we asked the unlucky fellow why he did such a thing, he might reply with indignation: ‘Well, it was the perfectly rational thing to do; I had every reason to think the glass contained gin; why in the world should I think that someone would be going around putting petrol in the cocktail glasses!?’ Here the unlucky subject, in our view, is not providing an excuse for his action … ; he is defending it as the action that made the most sense for him to do and the proposition that made most sense to treat as a reason. He is providing a justification, not an excuse (125).

Myself, I think this is a mistake - we excuse wrongful actions by showing that the agent was nevertheless perfectly reasonable for having performed them. If the thing wasn’t reasonable for the agent to do, what excuse could there possibly be?4

Let’s bracket that for now and look at how they describe the case. On their view:

(1) What justified Coop in giving Audrey the toxic stuff was that there was gin and tonic in that glass.

Why say that? Perhaps because we think because Coop was justified in acting and justified in treating that there was gin and tonic in that glass as a reason for acting. So, you might think that JJ commits us to saying it. They deny that (1) entails that there was gin and tonic in that glass and suggest that a parenthetical remark cancels whatever implication suggests that (1) is true only if there was gin in the glass:

(2) What justified Coop in giving Audrey the toxic stuff was that there was gin and tonic in that glass, as he thought at the time.

I don’t think this parenthetical remark cancels the implication. So, I’m with those writers who think that ascriptions of normative reasons are factive.5 Part of the reason is that it seems that (1) entails (3):

(3) Coop was justified in giving Audrey the toxic stuff (in part) because there was gin in the glass.

If (1) entails (3), (1) cannot be true if there was no gin in the glass because ‘p because q’ is factive. (It cannot be that ‘p because q’ is true unless ‘p and q’ is true.)

The linguistic intuitions that convince me that (2) does not cancel the implication that there was gin in the glass and that convince me that (1) entails (3) tend to point towards views I like. I don’t know if my views or intuitions are my cart or my horse. Bracket the linguistic considerations. Notice that one thing that justifying or normative reasons are supposed to do is show that something is favorable. Favorers, I take it, can explain what makes something favorable or attractive. So, if in describing the justifying reasons that justified some S’s Φ-ing, I take it that in saying that p was a normative reason for S to Φ, I am committing myself to further ‘because’ claims such as ‘Φ-ing had something going for it because p’. Such a claim is true only if the explanans proposition is true, so it seems we have further evidence that ascriptions of normative reasons are factive. One way to deal with this worry is to deny that you can subtract truth from knowledge-level justification. If we can make an intuitive case for JJ without building in any substantive assumptions about what the correct account of justification should look like, perhaps we should use JJ to argue from the falsity of (1) against the commonly held view that there can be justified, false beliefs.

Here is a second concern. JJ can be read it in two ways. On the first reading, it is all about the epistemic: if you justifiably believe p, there is nothing epistemically improper in treating p as a reason for belief or for action (JJ). On the second, it’s not all about the epistemic: if you justifiably believe p, there is nothing epistemically or practically improper in treating p as a reason for belief or for action (JJ+).6 In some places, Fantl and McGrath speak as if they think that justifiably believing p means p justifies acting. Given that they take justifying to amount to something like obliging, mandating, or requiring, it seems they are committed to the claim that if S justifiably believes p knowing that Φ-ing is best iff p, the subject is required to Φ if she justifiably believes p. In other places, they express reservations about JJ+ and so might avoid the difficulties here by opting for JJ-. I think it would be wise for them to deny JJ+.

Suppose that in w1, Audrey sees an infant and a kitten in trouble. She knows infants matter more than kittens and so she believes that it’s better to save the infant. She knows she can save the infant. She deduces and justifiably believes she ought to save the infant from the premises that this is the best and this is something she can do. What should she do? JJ- doesn’t say. JJ+ says that she ought to save the infant.

In w2, Audrey is in the same non-factive mental states as she is in w1. Suppose this means that the same beliefs are justified for her. She reasons just as she does in w1 does and so reasons from the justified belief that it would be better to save the infant and the justified belief that she can save the infant to the justified belief that she must save the infant. If her justifying reasons include that she must save the infant, JJ- justifies her in believing things like that she must do what she takes to be necessary for saving the infant. JJ+ says that she ought to save the infant. Apart from describing Audrey’s non-factive mental states, I’ve not said anything about what’s happening in w2. Suppose she can’t save the infant. According to ‘ought’ implies ‘can’, it’s false that she ought to save the infant. If JJ+ implies that it would be true that she ought to save the infant if she ought to believe she ought to save the infant, it’s false that she ought to believe she ought to save the infant. And, if that’s false, it’s either false that she ought to believe that it’s best to save the infant or false that she ought to believe she can. And, if we say that what someone ought to believe supervenes upon this subject’s non-factive mental states, it’s false to say in w1 that Audrey ought to believe she ought to save the infant. In turn, it’s either false to say in w1 that she ought to believe she can or to say in w1 that she ought to believe that’s best. And that’s crazy. JJ+ forces us to choose between OIC and what is starting to look like a rather skeptical view: you mustn’t believe both that you can Φ and it’s best to Φ unless both would be true in every possible world involving a mental duplicate of yours.

If Fantl and McGrath deny JJ+ and stick with JJ-, this takes care of the problem. If we’re to make sense of this sort of view, we have to understand how it’s possible for there to be something that you (epistemically) ought to believe to be a reason (e.g., that I must Φ) that (epistemically) ought to figure in deliberation that (practically) you oughtn’t let lead you to Φ. We would have to distinguish between the conditions that determine whether p is a normative reason in the sense that it is something that goes towards determining what an agent ought (practically) to do and the conditions that determine whether the subject is (epistemically) justified in going on believing, settling deliberation, and acting as if p is a normative reason. In turn, we have to deny that justifiably believing p and justifiably treating p as if it is a normative reason entails that p is a genuine normative reason. If this distinction makes any sense, they can put it to work to deal with the problem that arose for JJ+ and the problem of false justifying reasons.7


Derose, K. 1992. “Contextualism and Knowledge Attributions”. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 52(4): 913-929.

Doris, J. and G. Russell. 2008. “Knowledge by Indifference”. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 86: 429-37.

Dougherty, T. and P. Rysiew. 2009. “Fallibilism, Epistemic Possibility, and Concessive Knowledge Attributions”. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 75: 558-89.

Gardner, J. 2007. Offenses and Defences. New York: Oxford UP.

Gibbons, J. 2009. “You Gotta Do What You Gotta Do”. Nous 43: 157-77.

Hornsby, J. 2007. “Knowledge in Action”. In A. Leist (ed.), Action in Context. New York: De Gruyter.

Sorensen, R. 1988. “Dogmatism, Junk Knowledge, and Conditionals”. The Philosophical Quarterly 38: 433-54.

1 They are building on the work of Dougherty and Rysiew (2009), but they think the best way to develop this approach is in an impurist framework that might be an anathema to Dougherty and Rysiew.

2 Just to be clear, the principle does not say that if you know p you may use p to justify any F-ing you like but only that if you F in the belief that p, you might lack sufficient warrant for F-ing but it will not be because your belief in p lacked the necessary epistemic credentials.

3 I think Fantl and McGrath are willing to tolerate some of the strange implications of their view, as it seems all the views have to say something strange about knowledge or ‘knowledge’. Jonathan Ichikawa reminded me that these kinds of cases are already discussed in Doris and Russell (2008).

4 When the distinction between excuses and justifications does pop up in the epistemological literature, it’s often the case that epistemologists take as their example of excusable action behavior that is blameless because the agent engaged in it is insane. While I’m not in favor of blaming lunatics for what they do, this ignores the work of those writers who think that there are many ways of removing blame. Excuses are often distinguished from denials of responsibility or exemptions. Both involve removing blame, but they do it in different ways - one shows that the failure to act on the stronger reason does not call into question the assumption that the agent is responsible and reasonable and the other calls into question the assumption that we’re dealing with the work of a responsible, reasonable agent. The question as to whether cases of ignorance and mistaken belief are properly classified as cases where excuses are appropriate is a difficult one. For a discussion, see Gardner (2007).

5 I’m with Hornsby (2007: 291) on this point. The parenthetical remark does not cancel the implication.

6 This is the view I prefer and the view defended by Gibbons (2009). Those who reject JJ+ but accept JJ on the basis of the subtraction argument should have to explain why they like the subtraction argument for justified belief and justifying reasons for belief but not justified action and justifying reasons for action.

7 I want to thank Jonathan Ichikawa for corresponding with me on some of these issues and also thank Jeremy Fantl and Matt McGrath for many extended exchanges.