Knowledge, Language, and Interpretation: On the Philosophy of Donald Davidson

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Maria Cristina Amoretti and Nicla Vassallo (eds.), Knowledge, Language, and Interpretation: On the Philosophy of Donald Davidson, Ontos, 2008, 224pp., €89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380002.

Reviewed by Daniel Laurier, University of Montreal


This book is a collection of nine essays devoted to the interpretation and assessment of various aspects of Davidson's philosophical legacy, preceded by an introduction (by the editors) which provides a quick survey of some of Davidson's well known views on interpretation, truth, ontology, triangulation, etc., and summaries of the main chapters. The first four essays address rather specific issues in the philosophy of language, while the others deal with such topics as the normativity of the mental, Davidson's views on ontology and conceptual schemes, and the compatibility of Davidson's brand of externalism with anomalous monism and first-person authority. They will be of interest, primarily, to people who are actively engaged in "Davidsonian studies". But even from this point of view, they are of varying interest and quality, ranging from the nearly irrelevant to the instructive and fairly convincing. In what follows, I try to give a glimpse of what is going on in each, taking them in their order of appearance, since there seems to be no better way to organize them.

In the first essay, R. M. Sainsbury asks to what extent it is possible to construct interpretive truth-theories for languages containing indexicals and other context-dependent expressions. He argues that although pure indexicals and demonstratives (such as 'I' and 'that') can be accommodated within a Davidsonian framework, there is no single general strategy available to deal with all putative forms of context-dependence, which must therefore be addressed on a case by case basis. He makes some positive suggestions as to how to deal with certain alleged forms of context-dependence, which, in effect, come down to a denial that they are genuine cases of semantic context-dependence. For example, he deals with the suggestion that the sentence 'Sid grunts' can be used to say either that Sid is a grunter or that Sid is grunting by denying that we need to find some contextual features with respect to which it will be assigned different truth-conditions. In his view, the fact that there are various specific ways of grunting should not prevent us from holding that 'Sid grunts' is true iff Sid grunts (in one way or another), period. This is fine as far as it goes, but, as Sainsbury himself remarks, there are other cases for which this strategy doesn't work, since, for example, 'Jill is ready' is not equivalent to 'Jill is ready for something or other'. Though he doesn't make any suggestion as to how to deal with such examples, he does leave us with the impression that the only way out, for a Davidsonian, is to deny that their truth-conditions depend on the context of utterance, and thus to maintain a sharp distinction between semantics and pragmatics. On the face of it, Sainsbury is primarily concerned with the viability of a certain "classical" way of construing the Davidsonian semantic project, as aiming to construct truth-theories for ordinary, public languages. His paper is best seen as a modest contribution to current disputes between "minimalists" and "contextualists" (see, e.g., Cappelen and Lepore 2005 or Récanati 2004), but doesn't fit very well with Davidson's later view that the interpreter should be concerned with truth-theories for temporary idiolects and not for public languages.

In the next essay, E. Picardi proposes to defend Frege's functional account of predication against Davidson's (and Quine's) deflationary account, according to which 'F' is true of x iff x is F. Having stated four conditions that an adequate account of predication should satisfy, she engages in a somewhat messy discussion of Frege's distinction between concept and object and of Russell's failed attempts to account for the "unity of the proposition", suggesting that Davidson's rejection of Frege's view rests on the same kind of misunderstandings found in Russell. A Fregean concept, she contends, should not (primarily) be thought of as a further ingredient of reality, but as 'an objective method for fitting arbitrary objects into a pattern' (p. 53). Indeed, one of Davidson's main points against Frege has always been that, thanks to Tarski, there is no need to assign a referent to predicates in order to account for the truth-conditions of (simple) sentences. At one point (pp. 71-72), Picardi seems to grant that 'the notion of reference as applied to predicates' rests of some of Frege's further epistemological commitments. She leaves unclear, however, exactly what these further commitments are and why anyone should endorse them. Moreover, since she doesn't clearly explain exactly how Frege's account is supposed to meet her four conditions (or how Davidson's fails to meet them), we are left wondering what could warrant her conclusion that Frege's account of predication is 'the best one at our disposal' (p. 75).

As M. Piattelli Palmarini reminds us at the beginning of the third essay, Davidson famously argued that an adequate account of the logical form of action sentences should see them as involving implicit quantification over events. Having endorsed this claim, he then provides a somewhat technical survey of some recent work in syntactic theory concerning the conservativity of natural language determiners (including quantifiers) and various related linguistic phenomena, with the purpose of defending the Chomskyan view that there are innate principles of universal grammar which have no plausible functional explanation in evolutionary terms. Since the linguistic hypotheses he discusses are only loosely related to any philosophical issue that may arise from Davidson's work (which is not to deny that they are of independent interest), I feel I don't have to say more here on this paper.

The next essay, by J. Hornsby, is an attempt to clarify what is at issue in the debate opposing Davidson and Dummett on the social character of language. She agrees with Dummett that linguistic communication requires that we make room for the notion of a shared language, while insisting that Dummett failed to engage with Davidson's argument that there is no such thing as a (shared) language and that a proper appreciation of the social character of language must rely on Davidson's idea of a communicative intention, the very idea he appealed to in arguing against shared languages. As she sees it, the main bone of contention between Dummett and Davidson is over the claim that knowledge of a shared language is necessary for (successful) communication between a speaker and an audience. Taking up the notion of a communicative intention, she describes a plausible case of non-linguistic communication which, she argues, is made possible by the fact that the speaker and the audience share knowledge of the natural meaning of something. She then jumps to the conclusion that in linguistic communication, what the speaker and the audience must share is knowledge of what Grice called the non-natural meaning of some artificial device: 'prior shared knowledge of what artificial devices mean would seem to be necessary for communication as we know it' (p. 117). One problem with this is that, even granting that shared knowledge of non-natural meaning is required for 'successful communication as we know it', this isn't sufficient to conclude either that this meaning has anything to do with what is normally understood as "conventional, literal meaning" (since both speaker's meaning and conventional meaning count as non-natural, in Grice's usage), or that such knowledge must be shared prior to the linguistic exchange. Moreover, it is unclear exactly how Hornsby's qualification 'as we know it' should be taken. If she means to be insisting on the fact that normal linguistic communication would not be as easy as it seems to be if speaker and audience didn't bring with them extensive knowledge of what the speaker's words mean, then this is probably not something Davidson meant to be denying. However that may be, this is an interesting contribution which makes a number of useful clarifications and addresses a very substantive issue.

In the fifth essay, P. Engel sets out to clarify in what sense Davidson's conception of interpretation warrants the claim that the mental is essentially normative; finding it to be somewhat anemic, he proceeds to make some suggestions of his own as to how the "norms of the mental", and especially epistemic norms, are best construed. Relying on extensive knowledge of Davidson's writings, Engel makes it clear that, although Davidson repeatedly speaks of the "norms of rationality" to which the interpretee should be found conforming, there is no clear sense in which these norms could be seen as giving rise to genuine and/or specific prescriptions. As he puts it (following Schroeder 2003), Davidson's norms of rationality are not regulative, but work essentially as 'idealized principles of description'. And this understandably dissatisfies people who, like Engel, want to maintain that the mental is normative in some genuinely prescriptive sense. Engel unfortunately doesn't say anything about why anyone should endorse such a strong form of normativism. Instead, he then gives a list of five plausible desiderata which a normativist conception of the mind should satisfy, and a very brief, but suggestive, sketch of how, according to him, they might be met. I cannot go any further into the many exciting issues that are raised in this last part of the paper, but I can testify that they are at the heart of much recent work in epistemology and the philosophy of mind.

A. C. Bottani's main purpose, in the sixth essay, is to question the general principle that 'radical interpretation requires metaphysical agreement' (p. 150), to which Davidson would certainly seem to be committed, since he notoriously held that massive agreement tout court is a condition of interpretation. What puzzles Bottani is how this principle could be reconciled with the seemingly obvious fact that many prominent, and prima facie perfectly "interpretable", philosophers are committed to wildly revisionary ontologies. He then proceeds to argue, quite efficiently, that the troublesome principle could be rejected while retaining both the principle of charity and the idea that interpretation should deliver a Tarskian truth-theory, but at the price of trading interpretation for translation. He is led, along the way, to unearth some of the deep tensions in Davidson's views on ontology and reference, without, however, giving us any clue as to how or whether they could be resolved.

The next (seventh) essay is M. Marsonet's attempt to rescue the notion of conceptual scheme from Davidson's well known attack. I shall be brief here, since I found this paper rather disappointing. Marsonet first expresses dissatisfaction with Davidson's equation of conceptual schemes with intertranslatable languages; he then turns to Ajdukiewicz's notion of 'conceptual apparatus', only to find out that 'Ajdukiewicz's theses are subject to the same criticisms we previously addressed to Davidson' (p. 176). He ends up with the unhelpful suggestion that conceptual schemes are 'a sort of practical metaphor which is supposed to convey the outcome of our characterization of reality' (p. 178). Well, as far as I know, the whole point of turning to languages was precisely to replace such metaphors with something more tractable. We are thus left pretty much where we were before Davidson (or Quine, for that matter) gave any thought to the subject.

In the eighth essay, M. De Caro first traces the evolution of Davidson's thinking on semantic externalism, culminating in his conception of triangulation as a necessary condition of thought which, he emphasizes, constitutes an original synthesis of causal and social externalisms, and also a development of themes that have long been implicit in Davidson's earlier works. He goes on to explain how this mature form of externalism eventually forced Davidson to move from the view that mental states supervene on internal physical states of the agent to the view that they supervene on physical states that may be partly external. In a very short concluding section, he insists that this new construal of psychophysical supervenience caused 'big problems' for other aspects of Davidson's philosophy, such as first-person authority, the possibility of radical interpretation, and the claim that mental states are token-identical to physical states, and suggests that if these problems prove to be intractable, then we should rather drop these other Davidsonian theses than renounce externalism. He doesn't, however, try to make a case that any of these problems is actually unsolvable, though this seems to be what he thinks. On the whole, this is a faithful presentation of Davidson's sometimes ambivalent views on supervenience and externalism.

In the last essay, which also is one of the finest and most carefully argued of the collection, M. C. Amoretti defends Davidson's views on externalism and self-knowledge against the charge first leveled by McKinsey (1991) that the combination of externalism and privileged self-knowledge unacceptably implies that we can have a priori knowledge of external facts (thus addressing, in part, one of the worries expressed by De Caro). She argues that, even granting that Davidson's brand of "triangular externalism" can be known a priori, it is of such a weak variety that the most that could be inferred from it is that if someone knows a priori that she has some belief, then she knows a priori that there is at least 'one other creature sufficiently similar to triangulate with her on the background of a mutual external world which is more or less as she thinks it is' (p. 216). She then insists that this is not as obviously unacceptable as if we could infer that we can have a priori knowledge of some particular external facts, such as the fact that there is H2O (as opposed to XYZ) in our environment. Though this paper does nothing to upset our understanding of the issues in this area, it is basically sound and convincing as far as it goes.

On the whole, then, this book contains much valuable material, and constitutes a potentially useful addition to the secondary literature on Davidson, though it could hardly be described as 'compulsory reading', except, perhaps, for the most committed Davidsonian scholars.


Cappelen, Herman and Ernest Lepore (2005) Insensitive Semantics, Oxford, Blackwell.

McKinsey, Michael (1991) 'Anti-Individualism and Priviledged Access', Analysis 51, 9-16.

Récanati, François (2004) Literal Meaning, Cambridge, Cambridge U. Press.

Schroeder, Timothy (2003) 'Davidson's Theory of the Mind is Non Normative', Philosopher's Imprint 3,