Knowledge, Nature, and the Good: Essays on Ancient Philosophy

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John M. Cooper, Knowledge, Nature, and the Good: Essays on Ancient Philosophy, Princeton University Press, 2004, 400pp, $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 0691117241.

Reviewed by Pierre Destrée, University of Louvain


John Cooper's first collection, Reason and Emotion (1999, Princeton University Press), has been widely recognized as one of the most important books on ancient ethics. This second collection, which include thirteen essays, may be considered a companion volume since it offers a series of articles on subjects which were excluded from the first collection, as well as essays on ethics and other subjects, which have appeared since 1999. Its title corresponds to the three main areas of the essays. Chapters 1-4 are on Theory of Knowledge: (1) 'Method and Science in On Ancient Medicine'; (2) 'Plato on Sense-Perception and Knowledge (Theaetetus 184-186)'; (3) 'Plato, Isocrates and Cicero on the Independence of Oratory from Philosophy; (4) 'Arcesilaos: Socratic and Skeptic'; chapters 5-9 on Natural Philosophy: (5) 'Aristotle on Natural Teleology'; (6) 'Hypothetical Necessity; (7) 'Two Notes on Aristotle on Mixture'; (8) 'Metaphysics in Aristotle's Embryology'; (9) 'Stoic Autonomy'; and chapters 10-13 are on Ethics: (10) 'Two Theories of Justice'; (11) 'Plato and Aristotle on "Finality" and "(Self-)Sufficiency"'; (12) 'Moral Theory and Moral Improvement: Seneca'; (13) 'Moral Theory and Moral Improvement: Marcus Aurelius'. As in the previous collection, most of the essays are reprints; four of them (chapters 1, 7, 9, 11) are expanded versions of papers appearing elsewhere, and one (13) appears here for the first time.

As becomes apparent, the themes studied are extremely different, as are the periods and philosophers, ranging from the late 5th century BC author of On Ancient Medicine to Marcus Aurelius. Yet there are two close links among all these essays: a methodological link, and a more substantial one. The first link is explicitly expressed by JC in his preface: the aim of his research is "to understand and appreciate the ancient philosophers' views in philosophical terms drawn from the ancient philosophical tradition itself (rather than bringing to them, and interpreting them in terms of, contemporary philosophical concepts and debates)" (vii). This defense of the history of philosophy, against what might be (and actually has been) called a re-appropriation of ancient themes in contemporary philosophy that too often succumbs either to anachronism or to forced interpretations, has two major concerns. There is, first of all, the very basic motto of rendering justice to the texts themselves and their doctrines by insisting on their embeddedness in a context. The most noteworthy example is JC's reinterpretation of the famous problem of Aristotle's determination of happiness in the Nicomachean Ethics, which he now understands in a very intellectualistic (or 'dominant') way, against his own two previous interpretations,[1] by explicitly confessing that "in the past (he had) resisted that interpretation and (had) proposed more than one way of reading Aristotle's texts so that they do not involve this idea"; the reason for that improvement of his own readings being that he has been "impressed by the evidence presented above to the effect that it is Aristotle's actual view" (296). The second major concern is his respect of the global context of the doctrine of such and such a philosopher or philosophical movement. It is notably such a requirement that is at the core of JC's interpretation of Stoic ethics, which cannot be detached from their metaphysical claims (cf. Chapter 9). But such a rather traditional defense of the method and aim of the history of philosophy is not to be confused with what might be called a purely historicist history of ideas (more or less what Nietzsche called an antiquarian conception of history), unrelated to our own philosophical interests. Here again JC himself presents his essays as possible confrontations for us philosophers today with ancient philosophers whose texts and doctrines should remain important sources of philosophical interest: "Through engaging creatively and philosophically with the ancient philosophers' views, these essays aim to make ancient philosophical perspectives available in all their freshness, originality, and deep, continuing, philosophical interest to philosophers and philosophy students of the current day" (vii). By "engaging creatively" I suppose Cooper means, not only the art of reconstructing arguments by linking concepts or texts which are not explicitly linked by the author himself, but also, and more importantly, the art of interpreting an author by asking him questions he doesn't himself raise, but that are pressing for us, and by trying to answer them with the resources of his own concepts and commitments.

To the extent that the history of philosophy aims to be creative, while not forgetting the two rules against anachronism or forced interpretations I have stressed, these essays are also advocates for the philosophical interest of ancient philosophy for us today. And it is precisely here that one may establish a second, more substantial, link between these essays: JC vigorously claims that reason or understanding is the keyword of Greek philosophy, and if he accepts the now famous determination of ancient philosophy by Pierre Hadot as "a way of life", it is under the very strict conditions (and partly against Hadot's own interpretation of that motto) that we interpret that life as a life of reasoning or understanding. Let me review some aspects of what exactly should be understood by such a life of reason, which JC openly admires and even passionately defends both as the core of Greek philosophy and as of major interest for us today.

At a very basic epistemological level, where, so to speak, our life of understanding, as interpreters, aims to join that of the philosopher being considered, one of the most constant motives of JC's interpretations is to provide the very reasons why such and such a philosopher held such and such a theory, and to make us see how and why those arguments were perfectly reasonable. In the field of the philosophy of nature, one example among others is his explanation of Aristotle's conception of teleology: if we interpret teleology as constituted by the very fact of the permanence of species (which was very hard to deny before Darwin), Aristotle's conception of nature is far more reasonable than that provided by Empedocles or the atomists, relying as they did on unexplainable fantasy or disorder. Another example is the case of Arcesilaos' skepticism: contrary to a Sextus Empiricus, Arcesilaos was an authentic Socratic philosopher (and one is tempted to say, by way of slight exaggeration, an authentic Greek philosopher) by rejecting the reliability of reason on the basis of reasoned argument itself. Between epistemology and ethics, we have two major descriptions of what a life of reason should be. A negative one with Seneca who doesn't respect his own engagement with the Stoics' very intellectualist conception of moral improvement, since he openly dismisses the importance of Chrysippus' logical exercises, which are a means for such a moral improvement; instead, as a spiritual director, Seneca too often uses rhetoric and seems to content himself with providing "a mere feeling of conviction" (313) which is far removed from a real Stoic conception of moral conviction. The positive example is that of Aristotle's intellectualistic, according to Cooper, conception of eudaimonia as a monistic good that all our actions and choices are (should be) aiming at. Here praise for the life of reason is at its zenith: the very reason why a moral action is worth choosing is not that it is a means to contemplation (according to some intellectualistic interpretations), but that it is a way of approximating contemplation or understanding oneself, 'practical truth' being interpreted as an approximation or imitation of the attainment of the truth which itself determines the 'theoretical life'.

All these essays, a few of which I have merely sketched, are major achievements in their field. They are innovative, and provide new and fresh approaches to well-known texts and problems; they are always clearly written and (for the most part) accessible to non-specialists too (even if the proposed interpretations are always supported by careful and meticulous analyses of the texts). They will all certainly be of great interest to specialists as well to non-specialists, to academics as well to students. Some chapters (in particular, numbers 5, 6 and 8 on Aristotle's natural philosophy) are already classics, and I have absolutely no doubt that many of them (at the very least chapters 1, 4, 9 and 11, which are probably the best new material) very soon will be.

Still, the status of 'classic' should not inhibit, but rather sharpen our critical sense. There are two kinds of criticisms in which readers should engage. The first kind concerns some of JC's claims as to whether particular pieces of textual evidence or lines argument are convincing, and the second one is about his praise for the life of reason. Let's examine briefly an example of the first kind. For Aristotelian scholars, and more generally for scholars and students who have a special interest in Greek ethics, one of the most exciting chapters of this collection will certainly be the new reinterpretation it offers of Aristotle's conception of eudaimonia (chapter 11); I believe, though, that it is much more controversial than JC seems ready to admit (as maybe every interpretation of that so profoundly puzzling theme should be condemned to remain?). Of course, we should admire the open-mindedness of the interpreter, who doesn't hesitate in modifying his own views once again, the evidence of Aristotle's text being veritas amicissima -- no matter how influential his own previous views have been! But is the evidence that JC now confesses to having no longer been able to resist really that compelling? I certainly won't be the only one who (still?) resists it, and remains more persuaded by his previous interpretation, which was consonant with the widely accepted so-called inclusive view of Aristotle's conception of happiness. It is impossible to go into detail here, but, by using JC's own favorite method of stressing respect for the text and context, here are just a very few remarks. To be sure, the most fascinating part of this study is the way it convincingly argues that Aristotle re-employs the criteria of the good from Plato's Philebus in his own way and uses them in order to reject Plato's conception of the mixed life, but accepts and defends Socrates' proposal of seeing in the noûs the ultimate or final good constituting happiness. JC is also certainly right to analyze finality (by understanding teleios from its link to telos, as Aristotle explicitly does at NE, I, 7) and self-sufficiency as the criteria of being chosen for itself. But the reduction of that final good to contemplation remains a very controversial interpretative option (and one which is certainly not mandatory even if one agrees with the interpretation he gives of Aristotle's approval of Socrates' conception, since noûs in the Philebus does not necessarily mean contemplation in the Aristotelian way). For there are two details Aristotle gives in that chapter I, 7, which is the focus of JC's analysis, which, I think, are very difficult to interpret in the framework of such a reduction. The first runs as follows: "We do always choose happiness because of itself and never because of something else, while as for honour, and pleasure, and intelligence (noûs), and every excellence, we do choose them because of themselves … , but we also chose them for the sake of happiness" (1097b1-4). Whatever the exact status may be of those subordinate goods, the evidence of the text doesn't suggest that the activity of the noûs, which cannot but be contemplation, is what Aristotle means by happiness.[2]

The second detail is that the good which constitutes happiness must be self-sufficient, i.e. absolutely or unqualifiedly choiceworthy, "not for oneself alone, for the person living a life of isolation, but also for one's parents, children, wife, and generally those one loves, and one's fellow citizens, since man is by nature a civic being" (1097b8-11). If Aristotle had meant to say that the highest good constituting happiness is contemplation as the final end chosen for itself, this is, to say the least, a very strange remark, since contemplation doesn't constitute the good that fulfills the political nature, as such, of human beings; and a little further, in chapter 10, Aristotle clearly says, by way of summarizing all his research thus far, that political science, whose "end is the best", is "dedicated above all to making citizens of a certain quality, that is good and doers of fine things" (1099b30-32). Of course, contemplation may be (and eventually can, as I think) be part (and perhaps the best part) of such "fine things". But if Aristotle had wanted to present a very intellectualistic or 'dominant' version of happiness, would he not have been better off not insisting so much on our political nature and the moral actions it requires?

Now, from a broader context, there is at least one other major reason why one might still be tempted to interpret Aristotle's conception of happiness in an inclusive way. I see no reason for not taking together the expression teleia eudaimonia in book X, 7 and 8, by which Aristotle characterizes contemplation, and the expressions teleia philia and teleia dikaiosunê we find at the core of Aristotle's treatment of those virtues. Let's take the virtue of justice, which is described as teleia because it is other-regarding, and not self-regarding. Justice however shares a common characteristic with the other virtues, that is, I suggest (it is not explicit in this text) the kalon; since the kalon is something difficult, and therefore admirable, justice, which is the most difficult moral virtue, is the most kallistê aretê (I suggest here too, since it is not explicit here either). But Aristotle also says that this teleia aretê is a whole aretê, a whole virtue, or a complete virtue, and that is because, as he says explicitly, justice implies, in one way or another, the other virtues, such as courage or temperance. If we apply such a schema to our case of eudaimonia, one immediately sees that contemplation (the analogue of justice) cannot at all be the focus or the reason why one is moral, as JC puts it,[3] and therefore it is not the end of all our actions or activities, the one Aristotle recommends his readers have (cf. I, 1, 1094). Since justice is the best virtue, it is certainly true that a virtuous man must have justice in mind in order to be fully, or completely virtuous; analogously, a happy man must have contemplation in mind in order to be completely happy. But that doesn't mean that justice is the end of all virtuous decision or behavior, nor that contemplation is the end every happy man should have in mind, consciously or not, in order to be happy.

A second kind of critique may arise from the more general viewpoint of the interest that the very strong conception of the life of reason JC defends may have for us. Let me specify that JC obviously understands that interest as only indirect, so to speak. So that even if Aristotle's emphasis on contemplation as the paradigmatic case of happiness is miles away from our philosophical concerns about morality, the main interest we may have in reading Aristotle's conception of eudaimonia the way JC does, is his conception of morality as a quest of truth. Similarly, we may agree with JC that a more substantial conception of reason would be more interesting than the very formal one we have inherited since Kant, and that the conception the Stoics have is a sort of example we may admire, even if, of course, it is not the case that we should link autonomy with the law of Zeus as such, or believe in the providence that is the expression of Zeus' reason. In that context, one understands perfectly well why JC is so keen on stressing the unfaithfulness of a Seneca or a Marcus Aurelius vis-à-vis their own commitments to Stoic orthodoxy, by considering them as almost renegade to that ideal of the life of reason. Still, one may wonder whether such an unfaithfulness to Stoic orthodoxy might not be very positive and of more direct interest to us. As Julia Annas recently argued,[4] one might well also see in the indecision Marcus Aurelius presents before an atomist theory or a holist and providentialist theory a way of announcing the not yet accomplished character of the moral progression of the apprentice philosopher, Marcus Aurelius himself (he who explicitly avows that he has not yet perfectly understood the questions of natural philosophy) being the prototype or the paradigm of such an apprenticeship. One might extend this interpretation to the use that Seneca and Marcus Aurelius make of rhetoric: it is an instrument of moral improvement intended for the apprentice philosopher who has not yet grasped all the real reasons for the moral convictions he is encouraged to believe, and incited to put to work. From the viewpoint of the history of philosophy, such an interpretation would be surely more charitable (and, for that matter, would also afford us a better understanding of the only implicit resonances of Platonism, as well as Aristotelianism in these authors), and from our point of view as philosophers today, would certainly be more directly attractive.

[1] Reason and Human Good in Aristotle, Harvard Univ. Press, 1975, chap. III; 'Contemplation and Happiness: A Reconsideration', in Reason and Emotion, chap. 9.

[2] JC quotes this passage in his note 16 (281), which he interprets in this manner: "no good 'subordinate' to eudaimonia, such as pleasure, is choiceworthy at all except when it is chosen for the sake of eudaimonia". But, if contemplation has the same status vis-à-vis eudaimonia as pleasure, doesn't that mean that contemplation, too, is such a subordinate good vis-à-vis happiness? Or in order to avoid such a consequence, one has to understand noûs here as meaning something different, like intelligence in general or a technical intelligence. But that seems very unlikely, since Aristotle takes up the various answers to the question of knowing what the good is in chapter 5, where we do not find a general or technical meaning of noûs.

[3] Cf. 305, note 58: "One cannot be acting morally virtuously unless one has vividly in mind … that there is something better … . Presumably because of limitations in their own natural capacities and talents, the people leading this life do not engage in contemplation, but they are nonetheless aware (vaguely …) that there is something humanly better than moral action …".

[4] "Marcus Aurelius: Ethics and its Background," in RHIZAI: Journal for Ancient Philosophy and Science 2 (2004).