Knowledge on Trust

Placeholder book cover

Paul Faulkner, Knowledge on Trust, Oxford University Press, 2011, 240pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199589784.

Reviewed by Peter J. Graham, University of California, Riverside


When and why are testimony-based beliefs warranted ("justified" in the broad sense)? Thomas Reid famously argued it was more like perceptual warrant. Reid and his "non-reductionist" followers claim we're prima facie entitled to take the word of others at face value. David Hume and his "reductionist" followers disagree. A hearer needs inductive, non-circular, non-testimony-based "reductive" reasons for thinking the speaker is competent and sincere.

Paul Faulkner rejects both sides, which is what makes his view so interesting. Warranted uptake requires a reason (pace non-reductionism), but not a reductive reason (pace reductionism). Faulkner's idea is that trust warrants uptake.

Faulkner's case against non-reductionism derives from the "problem of cooperation." Imagine a hypothetical state of nature, where rational individuals pursue their own interests and are able to use language to communicate with one another. In such a situation will speakers be committed to telling the truth? Faulkner says no, for linguistic communication as such is not designed to convey reliably accurate information from speaker to hearer; language as such does not "constrain" speakers to be trustworthy. For communication as such is an intentional, practical activity, where speakers and hearers communicate because of their interests. And their interests don't align. Hearers want the truth. But speakers want to influence what hearers believe and do. And so speakers don't want to be committed to telling the truth; they prefer the liberty to lie. Given speakers' interests and the lack of a defining, a priori constraint to be truthful in communication, speakers may lie as often as they tell the truth; it all depends on how best to influence the hearer. But if speakers are not committed to telling the truth, then hearers can't just presume that they will get the truth. Given only a speaker's presentation-as-true, a hearer cannot presume sincerity, and so cannot presume truth. He concludes there cannot be a default entitlement to take testimony at face value.

Faulkner rejects reductionism for two reasons. First, he thinks it too flounders on the "problem of cooperation," for without a "solution" to the problem we don't really understand why testimony is reliable; we don't understand why speakers commit themselves to telling the truth. The reductive solution presupposes an explanation without offering one. Without one, reductionism is at best incomplete.

Second, he thinks reductionism "distorts" and "over-intellectualizes" the moral psychology of uptake; it falsely characterizes why we rely on others. We don't usually believe what people say because we evidentially predict or assess their reliability. Instead we trust them. Though the reductionist's reasons would warrant uptake, they are not the central reason we rely on testimony. The "central reason . . . for an audience's uptake of a speaker's testimony can be no more than that the audience believes the speaker, or trusts the speaker for the truth" (emphasis added).

Given the problem of cooperation, this idea should come as a surprise. How could trust be our central reason that warrants uptake? Shouldn't distrust be our starting point? If speakers don't give a damn about our interests as hearers, then how could believing the speaker be anything but a dumb idea?

To see why Faulkner thinks trust can be our reason for uptake, we need to see why he thinks there is a "non-skeptical" solution to the problem of communication. A skeptical solution accepts that speakers are not committed to telling the truth and then recommends hearers take counter-measures. A "non-skeptical" solution, on the other hand, finds contingent, non-defining constraints on speakers added "on top" of practical reason and its role in communication. Given these constraints, speakers care about hearers' interests; speakers then prove reliable in communication. Once these constraints are in place and speakers are as a matter of fact committed to telling the truth, trust can be a reason for uptake. And so Faulkner agrees with the non-reductionist that speakers are constrained to tell the truth; he just disagrees with the non-reductionist about the status and source of the constraint.

According to Faulkner, speakers are committed to telling the truth, and telling it informatively, for they follow the social norm, tell the truth informatively; speakers normatively commit themselves to telling the truth. That's why testimony is reliable enough. But since we are hearers as well as speakers, we all follow the norm, when communicating, one should tell the truth informatively. And so hearers normatively expect speakers to tell the truth informatively, which Faulkner thinks just is to trust speakers to tell the truth, which he thinks can be, and often is, our reason that warrants uptake. The dual role of the social norm to tell the truth informatively means hearers can rely on trust as a reason for uptake, partly because speakers thereby prove trustworthy in communication.

To appreciate this we'll need to know (a) what social norms are; (b) why we follow social norms; (c) why following the social norm tell the truth informatively "solves" the problem of communication; and (d) why all of that makes trust a reason that warrants uptake.

Social norms are a huge part of human culture, along with conventions, customs, and other social institutions. Social norms in particular are (1) regularities in behavior in a population or group, that (2) members of the population prescribe or proscribe to members of the population or group, and so to themselves, where (3) the fact that members of the population prescribe or proscribe the behavior (partly) causes or sustains the behavior. Look at a culture, see how its members behave in various situations and examine to what extent their patterns of approval and disapproval support the behavior in question. Once you do, you've discovered its social norms.

There are roughly two reasons people follow social norms. First, people follow norms because they may desire the approval of others and fear their disapproval. This may be driven by the natural human tendency to desire the good opinion of others. It may also be driven by the promise of reward and the fear of punishment, for we often punish violators and award conformers. Second, people follow norms because they internalize norms. Though the cognitive psychology of norm internalization is not entirely well understood, the reality is familiar. We then follow the norm because we ought to do so, not because doing so will further some other end or interest we happen to have. In philosophical jargon, once internalized we experience the norm categorically, not hypothetically. We are then intrinsically motivated to follow the norm. Faulkner sees internalization as more important.

We live in a culture where tell the truth informatively is a social norm, so that (1) as speakers we regularly tell the truth informatively, (2) we prescribe telling the truth informatively, and (3) that prescribing truth-telling (partly) causes and sustains informative truth-telling in our culture. We've then found the matter of fact constraint we're looking for. The contingent, cultural, non-a priori social norm tell the truth informatively commits speakers to tell the truth informatively, especially when internalized. Speakers thereby constrain themselves to prove truthful in communication.

We should now understand why Faulkner thinks there's a "non-skeptical" solution to the problem of communication. But why should this also make trust a reason that justifies a hearer's uptake?

Faulkner distinguishes two kinds of trust. When we trust someone else to do something, we depend on him or her to do it. The two kinds differ over why we depend. In predictive trust, we depend on the other because we believe he or she will do what we depend on them to do. Suppose I believe my colleague regularly comes to work before I do and unlocks the Department Office. I may then decide not to bring my keys to work, as I don't need them. I depend on my colleague on good evidence that she's dependable. In affective trust, on the other hand, we don't predict that the other will prove dependable. Rather, we normatively expect the trusted to prove dependable. To normatively expect someone to prove dependable is not to predict that they will do it, rather it is to presume that the trusted person ought to prove dependable and so has a reason to prove dependable and so will prove dependable for that reason. To be a reason for Faulkner, it must provide the hearer with the resources in his or her psychology to construct an argument from the premise that the speaker asserted that P to the conclusion that P. Trust so understood does just that, for the hearer can argue that (i) the speaker can tell I need information, (ii) the speaker ought to tell the truth (for we ought to tell the truth informatively; we have internalized the norm), (iii) so the speaker will recognize she has a reason to tell the truth, so (iv) the speaker will tell the truth. When Faulkner says trust is our central reason for uptake, he means affective, not predictive trust. And so he might have called his book Warranted Uptake on Affective Trust.

But this, Faulkner notes, only explains why uptake is subjectively probable. What explains why uptake is objectively probable, he says, is the fact that speakers have internalized the social norm to tell the truth informatively. For when a speaker can tell that a hearer is depending on him or her for information (when the speaker recognizes the hearer's need), the speaker will have a reason to tell the truth informatively, for the speaker has internalized the norm. That's what makes it objectively probable that if the hearer affectively trusts the speaker (by depending on the speaker) that the hearer's uptake is objectively warranted. Faulkner's title might then have been Subjective Warrant on Affective Trust, Objective Warrant on Trustworthiness.

That's the main idea: non-reductionism can't be right because there is no a priori defining constraint; reductionism is incomplete and distorts and over-intellectualizes; but as speakers and hearers we internalize the social norm tell the truth informatively, which grounds the subjective and objective dimensions of warranted uptake.

There's a lot here that I find congenial. I think Faulkner's right to ask why testimony as an institution is as reliable as it is. I think he's right to turn to social science as well as moral psychology. And I agree wholeheartedly that social norms play a part in explaining why testimony is as reliable as it is.

But I don't accept his case against non-reductionism. The argument from the "problem of cooperation" rests on two premises: that speakers are not a priori constrained to tell the truth, and that entitlement as a kind of warrant depends on a priori, defining connections between the psychological process and truth. Given the importance of the second premise, you would expect Faulkner to at least discuss it, if not argue for it. Surprisingly, he does neither. And though I agree that a priori, defining connections may prove sufficient for entitlement, I don't believe they are necessary. Warrants, and therefore entitlements, depend on non-accidental, explanatory connections between psychological competencies and truth; they don't require a priori necessary, defining connections. Given the metaphysical contingency of the reliability of nearly every psychological process we possess, it would be surprising indeed to assume that entitlements require the metaphysical impossibility of error. Radical skepticism about nearly all warrants would be right around the corner.

Since I don't think his argument supports his conclusion, I'm not convinced that hearers must trust (in either of Faulkner's two senses) for warranted uptake. I don't deny that as hearers we've internalized the norm; I don't deny that we expect speakers to tell the truth informatively; and I don't deny that we can make sense of our reliance in light of the norm. And so I don't deny that we trust. I just deny that Faulkner has shown that warranted uptake requires trust (in either of Faulkner's two senses).

I even conjecture that the social norms explanation partly underwrites an entitlement to presume that speakers will prove reliable. This can be put in two ways, where the presumption means either a disposition to take the word of others, or the psychological attitude of normatively expecting a speaker to prove reliable.

Consider the first. According to the non-reductionist, we are entitled to take the word of others at face value, absent reasons not to do so. What's required to underwrite this entitlement is a non-accidental, explanatory connection between our psychological disposition to take the word of others at face value and truth; there must be some constraint on speakers explaining why our disposition is reliable enough. Whether the constraint is a priori defining or contingent empirical does not matter. The social norms account then provides the explanatory connection.

Second, even if reasons for uptake are required (as Faulkner believes), we can still ask why those psychological states really are reasons, i.e. we can ask why they are warranted and so serve as reasons. If the hearer's psychological attitude of normatively expecting the speaker to prove reliable provides the reason (as Faulkner believes), what warrants that attitude? What warrants the attitude of presuming the speaker will prove trustworthy? Here again the social norms account provides an explanation. If speakers internalize the norm, then the hearer's presumption would non-accidentally and explanatorily connect with truth. The hearer's presumption qua reason would be warranted because speakers commit themselves to following the norm. But then the presumption is warranted by an entitlement, not a reason.

Either way, once we drop the requirement that entitlements require a priori defining connections, the social norms account provides one way of explaining testimonial entitlements, either to the default disposition to take the word of others at face value absent reasons not to do so, or to the psychological presumption that speakers will prove reliable in communication because they should.

There's much more in Faulkner's book than I've been able to expound and examine, as you might imagine. As I said, there's much I find congenial. Without a doubt it's interesting throughout. Since everyone working on testimony should read Knowledge on Trust, I have a good reason for thinking they will.