Knowledge, Possibility, and Consciousness

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Perry, John, Knowledge, Possibility, and Consciousness, MIT Press, 2001, xvi + 221 pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-262-16199-0

Reviewed by Brie Gertler, University of Wisconsin, Madison


Perry’s engaging, droll style makes me wish I had attended his 1999 Nicod lectures, from which the material in this book was culled. His chief concern is to defend type physicalism from leading current arguments for dualism. While most of the moves Perry makes are familiar in their general outlines, the book is well worth reading for his particular spin on the use of broadly indexical features of thought to block anti-physicalist conclusions. Perry devotes nearly the entire book to defusing the three leading anti-physicalist arguments: the zombie argument, the knowledge argument, and the modal argument. He sees these as variants of a single type of argument, which he terms “experience gap” arguments. Perry also briefly uses his analysis of the experience gap arguments to oppose functionalism and other views that identify sensations with second-order physical properties. But dualism is Perry’s primary target.

According to Perry, the appeal of these three arguments stems from a mistaken assumption about mental content: namely, that the subject matter of a thought can yield an exhaustive account of that thought’s content. Perry contends, against this “subject matter assumption”, that formulating an adequate account of content may require us to “locate the knower relative to the subject matter”; in his terms, it must capture any “reflexive content” the thought has (p. 69). Exposing the reflexive content involved in evaluating the scenarios relevant to the zombie argument, the knowledge argument, and the modal argument will, he believes, allow type physicalism to accommodate the conceivability intuitions that these arguments exploit. Countenancing reflexive content will thereby block these arguments’ alleged anti-physicalist consequences. Perry acknowledges that this does not provide evidence in favor of physicalism. He terms his position “antecedent physicalism” to convey that, if correct, his analysis shows only that these arguments have no force against an independently established physicalism.

I will begin with Perry’s case against the zombie argument. Chalmers uses the apparent conceivability of a world physically indiscernible from ours, but in which our twins lack sensations, to show that sensations are not physical. Perry provocatively claims that the zombie possibility “really has virtually nothing at all to do with the issue of physicalism versus dualism”, but is instead “a test for epiphenomenalism” (p. 77). His case for this is as follows. Physicalist epiphenomenalism is compatible with a world very similar to the zombie world, that is, one in which all of the supposed physical causes and effects of sensations are present, but the sensations themselves are not. And dualists who accept the causal efficacy of sensations will, he says, deny the possibility of the zombie world. “Since conscious events make a physical difference, a physical world without them cannot be physically indiscernible from our own” (p. 79). He concludes that, since common sense weighs against epiphenomenalism, there is no reason for supposing that Chalmersian zombie worlds are possible; and even if they were possible, this fact would be neutral between physicalism and dualism.

I believe that this line of reasoning deeply misconstrues the zombie argument. The original argument stipulates that the relevant zombie world must be physically indiscernible from the actual world. Perry appears to invoke a stronger similarity requirement: the relevant zombie world must also approximate actual causal laws. (Cf. 77) This is why he sees the zombie possibility as inconsistent with the actual causal efficacy of even nonphysical sensations. If these were causally efficacious in the actual world, he thinks, then the zombie world would physically differ from ours, since the absence of sensations in that world would alter the course of physical events. However, Chalmers’ argument does not require that the causal laws remain the same in the zombie world. Indeed, Chalmers would deny that the causal laws remain the same in that world, for he maintains that sensations causally supervene on physical states. If sensations are physical, then the facts about sensations are entailed by the physical facts. The logical possibility of the zombie world is designed to illustrate the lack of entailment; it does not suggest, nor would Chalmers accept, that sensations are causally independent of the physical. Chalmers is officially agnostic about epiphenomenalism; for him, whatever force epiphenomenalism possesses results not from the possibility of zombies but from a distinct thesis, that the physical is causally closed.

With the second dualist argument, the knowledge argument, Perry begins to develop his notion of reflexive content. The resulting diagnosis of the knowledge argument is similar, in approach, to a line already popular in the literature. Perry claims that what Mary acquires, when seeing red for the first time, is a link between a descriptive concept, of brain state 52, say, and a “demonstrative/recognitional” concept, of the qualitative feature of “seeing-red” sensations. This link is effected by her forming a new belief, one which is true “iff the act of inner attention to which it is attached is of the subjective character of the experience of seeing red” (p. 148). The content of this new belief is thus reflexive. Perry explains the fact that Mary was unable to justify this belief before her release by saying that Mary lacked an “informational link” between her “detached” notion of brain state 52 and her “attached” notion of the qualitative feature of seeing-red sensations. (It has long been noted that Mary could have entertained the belief that “seeing red is like this”, while she was in the room, for she could have had a seeing-red hallucination; what she gains upon leaving the room is justification.) As it stands, this tack is a version of the “two ways” strategy, which claims that what Mary gains is a new way to know an old fact. Perry accepts this characterization, but adds that there is also “a new fact at the level of reflexive content” (p. 159). The new fact Mary learns is that the demonstrative/recognitional concept of seeing-red sensations and the descriptive concept of brain state 52 are co-referential. I think that the strongest objections to the “two ways” strategy concern the conceptual relationship between demonstrative/recognitional concepts and descriptive concepts. Since these objections also arise in the context of the third dualist argument, the modal argument, I turn to Perry’s case against that argument now.

The modal argument, advanced in its contemporary version by Kripke and Chalmers, does not centrally concern epistemic justification. Very broadly, the modal argument is this: even if we allow that a given phenomenal state-type is perfectly correlated with a given physical state-type, we can conceive that the former is instantiated without the latter (Kripke), or we can conceive that the latter is instantiated without the former (Chalmers). Identities are necessary, and conceivability is evidence of possibility. So there are no true phenomenal-physical identities.

Before objecting to the modal argument, Perry notes that Chalmers and Kripke recognize the need to “retreat from the subject matter assumption” (p. 198). But in his view they don’t retreat far enough; the subject matter assumption re-emerges in their contention that dualism can be established on a priori grounds. To explain the partial retreat from this thesis by Kripke and Chalmers, and the total abandonment of it by Perry, I will draw on Perry’s “manila file folder” analogy. (The book abounds with remarkably accessible illustrations of complex philosophical ideas.) The information in a file folder may be about a particular person in a variety of ways. (1) That person may be the origin of the file—it may have been created specifically to record information about her. (2) She may be the dominant source of the information in the file, even if the file did not originate for this purpose. (3) She may uniquely satisfy the descriptions in the file. (4) The information in the file may be applied to her, that is, she may be the applicandum of the file. Each of these conditions is independent, in that any one or more of them may be satisfied without the others. The subject matter assumption lends exclusive significance to condition (3), satisfaction or denotation.

Kripke’s analysis of natural kind terms and Chalmers’ semantics of centered worlds treat the other conditions as significant as well. But in Perry’s view they still overestimate the importance of the descriptive factor in the key case of phenomenal properties. Hence, he says, regarding Chalmers’ argument, “the natural place to balk is at the use of the level of primary propositions to model the thought of one who is considering the possibility of whether a given sensation is identical with a brain state.” (189) Chalmers’ primary propositions capture, roughly speaking, the descriptive content of the thought. He and Kripke maintain that it is this content which determines whether a concept is indexed to an external factor; and, they say, phenomenal concepts are not tied to external factors.

It is somewhat difficult to weave Perry’s remarks on this issue into a coherent picture. He acknowledges that phenomenal concepts have a “demonstrative/recognitional core”, and that “[a] Humean idea of pain necessarily resembles a case of pain” (p. 183). Yet he thinks that, even while attending to a sensation, we can be wrong about the referent of our thought. For reference is a matter of source or applicandum (conditions 2 and 4 of the file folder analogy), whereas what we are attentively considering is, roughly, the descriptive contents of the file (condition 3). And the source or applicandum may not satisfy the file’s descriptive contents. When these come apart, “the [phenomenal] concept will have as a source and applicandum a sensation that does not fit the Humean ideas that it incorporates” (p. 199). But in that case, it would seem that the Humean idea of pain doesn’t resemble a case of pain, at least if the notion of resemblance is, as seems plausible, a descriptive notion.

However, the basis of the crucial disagreement with Kripke and Chalmers, and of Perry’s rejection of the zombie, knowledge, and modal arguments, is plain. He thinks that there are scenarios which we cannot a priori eliminate as possibilities and yet which—given type-identity physicalism—are not genuine possibilities. These scenarios include: that we have zombie twins in a world physically indiscernible from ours; that (for Mary) this is what it’s like to see red, or to be in brain state 52; that pain exists in a world without C-fibers. While these are not real possibilities, there are possibilities in the neighborhood which account for the mistaken belief that they are possible. For instance, it is possible, though false, that my phenomenal concept of pain has as its source and applicandum a kind of state that is logically independent of C-fibers firing. By contrast, Kripke and Chalmers deny that causal factors such as source and applicandum determine what falls under my phenomenal concept of pain. This concept does not include a deferential component, so that local authorities can freely determine the proper referent; it does not index pain to any physical property, first-order or second-order. On their view, the phenomenal character of pain exhausts the phenomenal concept of pain, and thus nothing which fails to exhibit this phenomenal character will fall under the concept.

This raises a worry about Perry’s own position; to explain it, I turn to Perry’s two brief objections to token-identity physicalism, which identifies phenomenal properties with second-order physical properties, for instance, with functional role. His first objection to this view is that common sense dictates that a phenomenal state is a “local, first-order, inner state” (p. 87). His second and more compelling objection is this. According to token-identity physicalism, phenomenal properties are conceptually linked with second-order physical properties. (These second-order properties logically supervene on first-order physical properties; hence the identity at the level of tokens.) Perry denies the requisite conceptual link between phenomenal and second-order physical properties, on the grounds that such a link would entail that we can analyze or define the first-order phenomenal concept in second-order physical terms. He doubts that any such analysis or definition is available (p. 88). I agree with this argument against token-identity physicalism, but it seems to me to pose a challenge to Perry’s own type-identity view. Perry’s argument against second-order views trades on the recognition that justified identity statements must have some conceptual basis. But what is the conceptual basis for type-identity physicalism? Do we have any reason to think that first-order physical concepts could provide an adequate analysis of our phenomenal concepts? Perhaps his first objection to token-identity theories, that phenomenal states seem to be “local, first-order, inner” states, is meant to provide such a reason. But that claim is silent as to whether they seem to be physical states. The best way for Perry to meet this challenge is to use a tack which I did not see in the book: argue that it is a conceptual truth that phenomenal properties are defined by causal relations to their instances, such as being those instances’ sources or applicanda.

While I have followed the familiar practice of focusing on criticisms in this review, I want to close by emphasizing the book’s numerous and substantial virtues. Perry provides rigorous treatments of indexicality and reflexivity—including helpful (and entertaining) examples of what indexical knowledge provides—and links these treatments with the distinction between knowing-how and knowing-that. He reminds us that there is very little new under the philosophical sun, by beginning each chapter with a quotation from Herbert Feigl; these quotations cover a humblingly large portion of the territory (still) at the center of dispute on this topic. The book’s most significant contribution lies in its sophisticated exposition of the epistemic situatedness of thought, and the consequences which this situatedness has for type physicalism’s capacity to resist encroachment on each side, by token physicalism and by dualism.