Knowledge: The Philosophical Quest in History

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Steve Fuller, Knowledge: The Philosophical Quest in History, Routledge, 2015, 304pp., $49.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844658183.

Reviewed by Barry Allen, McMaster University


Once upon a time, scientific knowledge was the leisured pursuit of aristocrats. It was pursued for its own sake, the knowledge godlike, perfectly useless and beautifully true. Such knowledge was held to be attainable because human beings are daimonic, spiritual beings, not mere animals -- also not gods, but closer to gods than to animals. In pursuing scientific knowledge we were activating our best part, realizing the incipient divinity that is the dignity of our nature. Steve Fuller misses those days. He would like his science modern and his philosophy neo-neo-Platonic, reviving Greek rationalism with a Biblical twist.

On his account, all true knowledge -- the best, scientific knowledge -- belongs together and is good for the same reason: the quest after an empowering knowledge that will liberate us from irrational authority once and for all. Fuller wants a philosophy of science that recaptures this lost unity, "the normatively integrated history and philosophy of science that the success of Kuhn has made us forget." He knows he is against the grain of contemporary thought. After Feyerabend, Kuhn, and post-positivist philosophy of science; after Foucault, Latour, and Science and Technology Studies (STS), the unity of science could not stand more refuted. However, it is Fuller's thesis in this book that a "philosophically grounded argument about the ends of science" refutes the supposed disproofs of unity, and "justif[ies] science by natural-philosophical standards."

He unfolds two lines of argument. (1) One is to smear those who question the unity Fuller imparts to the sciences. The other (2) is to show "scientifically" that it is probable that human beings are not what current science thinks they are, that they are in fact godlike, as nothing else in nature is. That "theological" principle is then enrolled to define the mission of a unified institution and profession of science.

(1) He criticizes STS and analytic social epistemology on the same grounds. They fuel a "normative meltdown," a "normative recession," a "retreat from the classical philosophical aspiration of charting the growth of knowledge understood as 'science' in the robust sense of systematically organized knowledge made universally available." I think what he says is true and a welcome result, but Fuller thinks it is a crisis. He does not dwell on "analytic social epistemology," mentioning only Alvin Goldman and Philip Kitcher. He describes their work as neo-Comtean (that from the Auguste Comte Professor of Social Epistemology!), meaning, I think, that they are statist reactionaries rationalizing mass deference to authority. They are quickly dismissed for practicing "disciplinary cross-dressing, tarting up their epistemologically threadbare wares in a vulgar sociologism."

Fuller grows more expansive in his polemic against STS, especially exemplified in the work of Latour, Loraine Daston, and Peter Galison. The complaint again concerns that meltdown, the normative recession he sees their work as fueling. Their "decidedly anti-critical stance" has "evacuated the concept of science of any univocal meaning." Of course, that is a point agreed on all sides. Only the evaluation of it differs. Fuller thinks the trajectory from Kuhn to Latour "tracks the dissolution of the idea of knowledge as a public good." The history and sociology of science is now just one more field of expertise, safely segregated from interaction with the sciences they study. Any moral force for science-historical learning in the actual direction of the sciences is long gone. There is no philosophical ballast for the sciences. Indeed, the "normative regulation of both science and society has been effectively turned over to unconstrained markets, rendering STS the happy face of runaway neo-liberalism."

The mistake he sees in all this research into the sciences is "to deny that 'science' refers to a way of seeing the world . . . a type of knowledge distinct from other types." He calls "the Latourean sensibility" "Luddism's anti-intellectualist evil twin." Contemporary research in STS perniciously subverts science's righteous claim to be "an autonomous agent in the historical unfolding of reality." Their argument, which Fuller does not mention, is that when they look for evidence of this essence and autonomy they do not find it in the historical record. Some reason! Fuller scoffs at the historians' "tribal idol" of documentary evidence, and looks forward to a day when historical research will be conducted via virtual reality simulations of the past.

(2) A second line of argument promises to show how a very important property of human beings defines the unifying vision and common work of the sciences. He proposes to do that by reasoning that is itself "scientific." The argument, baldly, is this. There must be more to human beings than an evolved Darwinian body, because if there were not, science as we know it would be impossible. Given science as we know it, human beings cannot be Darwinian animals. Instead, because science is so unnatural, even super-natural, this singular capacity for scientific knowledge must be "the dominant feature of the human being," with the distinctiveness Plato imparted to epistēmē as proof of our divine power to access the truth of being. The putative failure of Darwinism to explain existing and historical science thus becomes a scientific reason for Fuller's "rather sympathetic portrayal of theology's presence in scientific epistemology."

A crucial part of this argument is the claim that Darwinism is practically refuted by the simple existence of science as we know it. A second argument supports that. If human beings were contingently evolved Darwinian bodies, then cognition would have to be an adaptation serving survival -- nothing more. If there were no more to us than Darwinian animals, knowledge would be "the cluster of capacities that enable us to reproduce successfully as a species . . . a synonym for 'adaptedness'" -- nothing more. He sneers at Dewey and Quine for believing in the continuity from adaptive animal cognition to common sense to science, a smooth glide, a continuous evolution. Fuller believes that science is categorically different from any natural process. It is divine, without the like in nature, and so are we who practice it.

What is the evidence for scientific supernaturalism? So far as I can make out it comes to the observation that one cannot explain science as it actually is on the assumption that it is just a glorified version of naturally evolved cognitive adaptations. Scientific practice exemplifies a transcendent ambition to universal knowledge that "defies naturalist scruples." It is knowledge of all things regardless of relevance to everyday life or species survival. It is knowledge articulated in a universal language. It is knowledge for everyone, a universal human legacy, and not some competitive edge setting group against group in a struggle for existence. Modern science has been methodically pursuing such knowledge ever since Newton, as has all science, less methodically, since the beginning. Supposedly no mere animal cognition, no mere adaptation, could do that, or would be dedicated to such values.

Spinoza showed us the answer to such arguments long ago. "[We] do not know what the body can do." (Ethics, 3P2) The last word is not in, the science not settled. We learn more every year about what bodies can do. Fuller thinks the "Abrahamic religions" are "the only clear historic basis" for the values that he reads into the history and practice of science. Yet it is simplistic Darwinism to suppose that cognition is no more than a static group of evolved adaptations. The human brain is the most complex natural system in the known universe, and the knock-on effects of the smallest evolved modification can be enormous, especially in the redistribution of potentials, Gould's spandrels, which can give rise to great effects that have nothing more than a fortuitous genealogical relationship to former survival. Art is an example. Science probably is, too. Fuller mentions (chapter 3) the possibility of this answer to his argument but he forgets or ignores it when he concludes that "the best explanation for the shape and persistence of science's fundamental questions is theological."

The most divine thing about us is scientific knowledge, and the most divine thing about science is its power to "second guess the divine modus operandi," figuring out the intelligent design in nature. It is natural for one with these views not to worry about the human future. We are too godlike for an ignominious slide into extinction. Add the Popperian idea that there can never be enough experiments, that we need conjectures furious and abundant (combined with the no less important work of refutation), and the unexpected result is close to what Nietzsche called fröhliche Wissenschaft. Experimentation is released from a priori limitations. Anything is allowed. There are no immoral experiments.

For Fuller, the overarching problem of social epistemology is to define the relationship between moral and epistemic values. On his account there is no real difference. No moral values are not ultimately served by the good of knowledge. If something is valuable for knowledge yet immoral, that is because we have applied the wrong moral time scale. If the scale is appropriately long term, then it is impossible for an immoral deed to contribute to knowledge. We are admonished against demonizing Nazi-like scientists who have the audacity to see far. "I have come to believe that we should take seriously the claim of extreme scientists -- including Nazi ones -- that their research aims to benefit the human condition despite possibly harming many humans in the short to medium term." (39) Short to medium term, indeed! "The march of progress is itself morally cleansing as we learn from our mistakes." Very gratifying for survivors.

Fuller takes all time as his moral horizon. "If eternal life in a perfect state is a serious project, then any pain and suffering in a finite interim is arguably a fair price to pay." Arguably! That is the view he calls Left Creationism, and with which he self-identifies. He does not explain why he thinks morality can be discussed in terms of terms like long and short. Apparently he does not think that what people do is right or wrong, good or bad, at the time they do it. Wickedness can only be judged from the long term. Only then will we know what was irredeemably wicked and not just seeming so due to short term pain and suffering. But is that not to excuse all wickedness? Keynes said that in the long term we are all dead. So we will have no way of saying that the wicked-seeming experiment is actually what it seems. Unless, of course, we are immortal.

Fuller wants a great goal to restore the lost philosophical ballast he thinks the sciences formerly enjoyed. Like Plato, Bacon, Comte, and Spencer, Fuller has a plan to get all the scientists and philosophers together in one enterprise. For Plato, the godlike quality of our nous was the contemplative power to enjoy a vision of the things themselves. Fuller wants the godlike nous, but interprets it biblically as the legacy of creation in the image of God. God is a creator, and we activate our divinity not in pure contemplative theory but rather by creation, construction, technical artistry, and scientific engineering, carrying on the unfinished work of divine creation. The mighty works of science now and especially in the future are "outright performing -- that is, acting out -- of divine intentions in materially novel ways ranging from socially engineered utopias to bio-engineered transhumans."

Fuller wants more of that. He wants "Humanity 2.0." That could mean some pretty grisly things for the short to middle term. Fuller somehow knows or believes and wants to tell us that the "role" of humanity is to be "the entity that God delegates to do the 'dirty work' of creation, which may include sacrificing some current forms of life in the name of some improved future forms." Thank god for that morally cleansing progress! "Over time humans grow into the role of the faithful agent -- and in the process acquire the ends of the divine principal as their own -- by pursuing means that often go against the grain of conventional morality." Gay science with a Creationist twist. "We must somehow believe that all the human and non-human lives lost through science-induced aggression, negligence, and obliviousness have contributed to a world that has maximized the welfare of more humans, understood as the highest form of life." Somehow!

The long-term welfare of humanity is the highest good. We accord science "the seriousness it deserves" only with a view of science that "does justice to the distinctiveness of our humanity." If, as seems likely, that excludes most of biology (inasmuch as it follows Darwin and finds nothing categorically distinctive about human beings), that does not concern Fuller. He thinks philosophy enjoys a "normative legitimacy over science." Apparently that means philosophers have some rational credential to tell science why it is important, what value it serves, and even, in pursuit of these "normative" presumptions, how scientific research should be organized. For instance, Fuller says that an appropriately "normative" philosophy of science has reason's authority to "accuse the [scientific] community of having taken one or more wrong turns," and to step in when "science" loses direction. These philosophers can tell the biologists, say, that they are wrong -- morally and scientifically wrong -- to dismiss creationism or intelligent design.

These normative philosophers of science will "make judgments about what is worth preserving, removing, and enhancing in future versions" of science. They have powerful theories of "cognitive economics" that tell them when suboptimal allocations of epistemic resources are deforming the rationality of science. "Our best epistemic enterprises provide the most cognitive benefit at the least cost," he says blandly. As if that luminous principle could guide anyone in the decisions of funding. Fuller's social epistemologists will intervene like the World Bank to redistribute credits and balance the books. After Fuller's audit, Kuhn gets too much credit, Popper not enough, Darwinism too much, Intelligent Design and Creationism not enough.

In my view, in this book Fuller lends support to some dicey propositions, including creationism and intelligent design, the ideas of Teilhard de Chardin, neurotheology, and transhumanism, not to mention an epistemology of divine psychology. By itself that would not trouble me. What troubles me -- I should say, annoys me -- is that he just avers these things. There is very little argument in this book. In place of it are obsessive self-citations to the author's other publications. That annoyed me because I had time and occasion to read his new book, only to find out that I cannot understand it without reading twenty others by the same author, including maybe even his dissertation. Without studying the earlier books, I can't understand the point of this one, yet nothing in this one makes me want to read those others.