Knowledge Through Imagination

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Amy Kind and Peter Kung (eds.), Knowledge Through Imagination, Oxford University Press, 2016, 250pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198716808.

Reviewed by Margot Strohminger, University of Salzburg


We often resort to the imagination to answer questions about the world around us. Can all of my furniture fit into my new apartment? How would Trump have reacted if he hadn't won the presidential election? How will British immigration patterns change if Brexit happens? It seems that the judgments we reach as a result sometimes constitute knowledge and even perhaps that the imagination is what is responsible for our knowledge. Given the ubiquity of cases like these, it is somewhat surprising how little systematic investigation there has been into an 'epistemic' picture of the imagination in contemporary epistemology. (According to the epistemic picture, the imagination can provide us with knowledge.) This collection of essays might help to change this. It addresses questions relating to the role of the imagination in the acquisition of knowledge.

The epistemology of the imagination is only beginning to emerge as a topic in its own right, and no survey of it yet exists. Given this, readers might have hoped to find a comprehensive overview of the important issues in the editors' introduction to this volume. Readers may be disappointed on this front. One reason is simply the way the editors Amy Kind and Peter Kung set up the debate. Their introduction revolves around what they call "the puzzle of imaginative use":

imagination is put to two distinct and seemingly incompatible uses. Imagination is sometimes used to enable us to escape or look beyond the world as it is, as when we daydream or fantasize or pretend. We'll call this the transcendent use of imagination. Yet imagination is also sometimes used to enable us to learn about the world as it is, as when we plan or make decisions or make predictions about the future. We'll call this the instructive use of imagination. But how can a single mental activity successfully be put to both uses? How can the same mental activity that allows us to fly completely free of reality also teach us something about it? (1)

As they see it, the task of the epistemologist of the imagination is to dissolve the tension between the transcendent and instructive uses or else concede that the imagination only has one use (presumably the transcendent use).

It is unclear why Kind and Kung's 'puzzle' of imaginative use is supposed to be a puzzle at all, since the pair of features they identify are not unique to imagination. Familiar cognitive capacities often, if not typically, have both transcendent and instructive uses. We use vision, audition, and so on to appreciate paintings, movies, and music, not simply to learn about the world around us. The view that the imagination can provide us with knowledge does not give rise to a puzzle as soon as we acknowledge that the imagination can also provide sanctuary from our immediate surroundings. After all, the same can be said of vision or audition.

We can better make an epistemic picture of the imagination feel puzzling in other ways. One way involves finding contrasts between sense perception and imagination. When you choose to imagine something, you typically succeed. Sense perception isn't like that. Try as hard you like, you cannot just choose to see a carnival before your eyes. So if the imagination is a source of knowledge inasmuch as sense perception is, we need to explain salient differences such as these with paradigm sources of knowledge. Or suppose you have an inventory of sources of justification or knowledge which does not include the imagination. Presented with cases such as the ones at the start of this review, you might ask why they cannot be explained using some combination of items already on the inventory. Perhaps the imagining is always accompanied by some other mental state or process that is responsible for the imaginer's knowledge. For example, perhaps the imaginer has an intuition that the relevant claim is true or infers it from some beliefs she had prior to the imagining or even makes explicit a belief she had all along.

The possibility of knowledge through imagination crops up in a range of philosophical debates. Some of the essays in the volume weigh in on these debates. In debates about knowledge of metaphysical modality, for example, one of the standard positions holds that certain imaginings can explain the possibility of some such knowledge. Jonathan Jenkins Ichikawa and Kung both discuss knowledge of metaphysical modality in their contributions. In "Modals and Modal Epistemology", Ichikawa suggests that our capacity for knowledge of metaphysical modality is rooted in our capacity for knowledge of modal claims used in ordinary thought. Kung's contribution examines thought experiments in ethics with forced choices between fixed outcomes. In "Thought Experiments in Ethics", Kung argues that we should be more cautious in using this type of thought experiment by first arguing for certain limitations on the imagination in providing knowledge of metaphysical possibility.

Another relevant debate concerns the capacity for attributing mental states to others, or what is often called 'mindreading'. Since many accounts of mindreading appeal to mental simulation, one might conjecture that we can use the imagination to know something about others' mental states. Heidi L. Maibom, Shannon Spaulding, and Jennifer Church discuss mindreading in their contributions. In "Knowing Me, Knowing You: Failure to Forecast and the Empathic Imagination", Maibom suggests that we often make errors as a result of simulation (or what Maibom calls 'empathic imagination'), and goes on to use this claim to motivate an alternative to offline simulation theory. In "Imagination Through Knowledge", Spaulding uses the case of mindreading to argue that the imagination is not "sufficient to bring about new knowledge of contingent facts about the world" more generally (208). In "Perceiving People as People: An Overlooked Role for the Imagination", Church discusses knowledge of others' mental states in the context of a broadly Kantian view that posits a kind of imagination operating in tandem with perception.

Two of the volume's contributions consider the role of the imagination in guiding action. This bears indirectly on an epistemic picture of the imagination since a natural explanation of how the imagination can successfully guide action is that it does so by producing knowledge. Peter Langland-Hassan's "On Choosing What to Imagine" seeks to explain how imaginings capable of guiding action and inference can also be subject to the imaginer's will. Neil Van Leeuwen's "The Imaginative Agent" outlines how emotions can arise from imaginative states, and then uses the resulting account to investigate two puzzles about fiction.

Some of the contributions address the prospects for an epistemic picture of the imagination more directly. In "Imagining Under Constraints", Amy Kind sets out to explain how "imagining has a role to play in justifying our contingent beliefs about the world" (146). To do this, she argues that two types of constraints operate only on those imaginings that are, in her phrase, "epistemically significant" (146). Magdalena Balcerak Jackson's "On the Epistemic Value of Imagining, Supposing, and Conceiving" offers accounts of imagining, supposing, and conceiving, each of which is supposed to play different epistemic roles.

To the reader with time to read only one of the volume's contributions, I recommend Timothy Williamson's contribution. Williamson provides a thought-provoking and accessible defense of an epistemic picture of the imagination in "Knowing by Imagining". In earlier work, Williamson has argued that we can use certain imaginative exercises to obtain knowledge of metaphysical modality. He does this by arguing for a conclusion of interest beyond metaphilosophy: we can use the imagination to obtain knowledge of counterfactual conditionals. [1] In this volume, Williamson defends an epistemic picture of the imagination from more general concerns -- ones that do not apply exclusively to knowledge of counterfactual conditionals or metaphysical modality. Williamson's framework for knowledge of counterfactuals would seem to prove fruitful for thinking about the role of the imagination in generating other kinds of knowledge, too. For example, Williamson briefly considers how we might use the imagination to assess whether we can do something; the method is the same as one we can use to evaluate whether we would succeed if we tried to do it (116-17). Surprisingly enough, however, Williamson's earlier counterfactual framework barely figures elsewhere in the volume. (The section on "Modal epistemology" in the editors' introduction does not even cite Williamson.)

As noted earlier, various philosophical debates have addressed questions relevant to the epistemology of the imagination. Revisiting them can facilitate our assessment of an epistemic picture of the imagination. This volume does not capitalize on some of the most obviously relevant debates, however. Philosophers of science have examined how thought experiments in the sciences work, where one of the main positions in the debate is that they can provide knowledge. In a similar vein, philosophers of art have asked whether, and how, we can learn from works of fiction. And very recently, epistemologists have asked what intuitions are and whether they are required to explain knowledge such as the kind sought by philosophers and mathematicians in the armchair (some of the central cases might also be explained using an epistemic picture of the imagination).

In the end the volume accomplishes less than what one might have hoped given its title. In order to assess an epistemic picture of the imagination, we need to fill in some crucial details: What are the relevant imaginative exercises? What do they provide knowledge of (or justification for)? What are we assuming in the background about the nature of knowledge (and justification)? We also need to try to develop alternative explanations of the same knowledge (or justified beliefs) to see how well explanations using the imagination fare. The volume does not take us very far in filling in these details. It is nevertheless an admirable effort to bring the imagination to the attention of epistemologists. The philosophical study of the imagination should not be confined to aesthetics and the philosophy of mind. The epistemology of the imagination is still only in its infancy, but hopefully this volume will help bring it up to a more mature state.[2]

[1] See especially Timothy Williamson, The Philosophy of Philosophy (Blackwell, 2007), Chs. 5-6.

[2] Thanks to Juhani Yli-Vakkuri for helpful comments.