Knowledge Transmission

Placeholder book cover

Stephen Wright, Knowledge Transmission, Routledge, 2019, 111pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138085275.

Reviewed by Arnon Keren, University of Haifa


Much of our knowledge is gained from others. If we didn't believe much of what we were told, we would know much less than what we take ourselves to know. But our acquiring knowledge from testimony does not depend only on our believing what others tell us; it also often seems to depend on their knowing that what they tell us is true. Thus Larry knows that the Knicks won the game because Sarah, who attended the game, told him so, and he believes her. However, if she didn't herself know that the Knicks had won, but would have truly asserted so as a result of a lucky guess, Larry's belief that the Knicks had won would not have constituted knowledge.

What is the nature of the dependence of listeners' testimonial knowledge on the knowledge of speakers? One influential but controversial view among epistemologists of testimony answers the question in terms of "transmission." According to this view, testimony functions to transmit knowledge from speakers to listeners. In the book, Stephen Wright presents the most developed extant articulation, and the most forceful defense to date, of the idea that testimony (at least often) serves to transmit knowledge and epistemic grounds to listeners.

The idea that testimony transmits knowledge has been understood in at least two different ways. Many early transmission theorists (Dummett 1994; Audi 1997) expressed the idea in terms of necessary or sufficient conditions for obtaining testimonial knowledge; Wright characterizes these claims as expressing a moderate version of the transmission idea.[1] Some supporters of moderate transmission views have claimed that a necessary condition for L's obtaining testimonial knowledge from S's testimony that p is that S knows that p (Audi, 1997); others have endorsed a weaker claim, according to which what is necessary for L's obtaining testimonial knowledge that p from S's testimony is not that S knows that p, but rather, that either S or some prior speaker in the testimonial chain knows that p (Dummett 1994). Common to both these moderate transmission claims is the idea that L can obtain testimonial knowledge that p only if someone else in the testimonial chain knows that p on the basis of some non-testimonial means. In this sense, testimony, it is claimed, can transmit knowledge, but cannot generate new knowledge.

There is another sense in which it has been claimed that testimony can be described as transmiting knowledge (Burge 1993, Keren 2007, Wright 2017). This kind of claim is spelt-out not in terms of the necessary or sufficient condition for obtaining testimonial knowledge, but rather through an explanation of how knowledge is obtained from testimony. On this kind of view, at least sometimes, listeners obtain knowledge from testimony in virtue of the fact that testimony allows speakers' epistemic grounds to be transmitted to listeners: A listener's knowledge may thus be grounded in the epistemic grounds on which the speaker's knowledge is grounded. On this kind of view, in virtue of her telling him so, and his believing her, Sarah's epistemic grounds for believing that the Knicks had won can become Larry's epistemic grounds for believing so. It is this strong transmission claim that Wright sets out to articulate and defend.

As Wright formulates the idea, "The transmission of epistemic grounds is a matter of a subject's epistemic grounds for ϕ becoming the listener's epistemic grounds for ϕ, in virtue of the fact that they are the subject's epistemic grounds for ϕ" (p. 7). Wright claims that it is this more fundamental idea of the transmission of epistemic grounds that should be appealed to in explaining the idea that testimony transmits knowledge: We can say that S has transmitted her knowledge that ϕ to L if L knows that ϕ in virtue of the transmission to L of epistemic grounds from S, who knows that ϕ.

The book's articulation and defense of the strong transmission view is divided into three main parts. The first explores what is involved in the strong transmission claim: It starts out by distinguishing between the moderate and the strong transmission claims (ch. 1), and goes on to articulate the most plausible version of the strong transmission idea (ch. 2-3). The case for strong transmission theories is then presented in the next two parts of the book. Chapters 4-6 present the argument for transmission theories. Here Wright's main claim is that transmission theories are indispensable to the epistemology of testimony, in the sense that alternative theories, which do not have a place for the transmission idea, cannot provide a complete, adequate account of testimony as a source of knowledge. The final chapter defends the transmission idea against several objections raised in the literature (Goldberg 2005; Lackey 2008). It thereby also presents the most important consideration cited in the book for favoring strong transmission theories over their moderate counterparts: namely, that the former can escape several objections, to which the latter succumb. On the way, Wright weighs in on several other debates in the epistemology of testimony and their relations to the transmission debate.[2]

Unlike moderate transmission claims, which seem to express rather intuitive (though not uncontroversial) ideas, the strong transmission claim may appear to depart radically from traditional epistemological thinking. How can Larry's belief that the Knicks had won be grounded in Sarah's epistemic grounds for believing so? While Wright does manage to present a strong case for the strong transmission view, the case is based almost solely on the claim that the view presents the best explanation of our intuitions about certain testimonial exchanges. Those who find the strong transmission idea mysterious or counterintuitive would have benefitted from a more extensive discussion of general considerations that seem to go against this idea. However, this is a very short book, and it devotes very little space to the discussion of possible considerations for or against the transmission idea, beyond its discussion of Wright's argument for it.

Indeed the book's brevity is perhaps its most serious shortcoming. Because of its brevity and the order in which Wright's account is presented, readers, especially those with no prior familiarity with the transmission debate, may find some parts of Wright's case for his strong transmission theory confusing. Thus, the book starts with a discussion of what is involved in the strong transmission idea: Wright appeals here to various thought experiments to argue for his favored interpretation of the strong transmission idea. The problem is that at this point in the book, we have been presented neither with reasons for accepting transmission theories, nor for preferring strong transmission theories to moderate ones. Accordingly, readers may not understand why examples discussed by Wright should be interpreted, as he does, through the lenses of a strong transmission theory, and why these examples can be marshalled against rival interpretations of the strong transmission idea. Likewise, his discussion of objections to transmission theories would leave many readers confused. Many of the objections discussed were originally presented as challenges to early transmission theories of the moderate kind. As Wright convincingly shows, strong transmission theories can avoid many of these objections. But since he does not discuss the history of the debate, and does not present strong transmission theories as a response to these objections, readers with no prior familiarity with the history of the debate might be left confused: Why would anyone think of these objections as challenges to the transmission idea, rather than as challenges to one version of transmission theories, briefly mentioned and quickly rejected in the very first chapter?

In spite of these shortcomings, the book does manage to render the strong transmission idea much less mysterious, and to offer it strong support. Wright's argument is based on the claim that epistemological accounts of testimony that reject the transmission idea cannot provide a complete, adequate account of testimony as a source of knowledge and epistemic grounds. He then suggests a strong transmission theory that, he claims, can succeed in this task. Wright's suggested theory is an externalist theory, which employs the idea that the modal profile of a belief -- construed either in terms of its reliability, safety, or sensitivity -- is what determines its epistemic status (for the sake of simplicity, Wright calls this idea, however construed, the "reliabilist" idea). What distinguishes Wright's theory from other reliabilist theories is the claim that the identity of the epistemic grounds which determine the epistemic status of a listener's belief is determined by the assumption through which a listener believes the speaker's testimony; that is, by the reason why the listener believes the speaker's testimony. It is this claim that allows Wright to make room for the transmission idea within a reliabilist framework.

To argue for the indispensability of the transmission idea, Wright first addresses internalist theories, arguing that they have counter-intuitive implications for certain types of testimonial transactions. Internalist epistemological theories, he claims, cannot explain our intuitions regarding certain cases of circular testimony, where a listener believes a speaker's testimony that p, when, unbeknownst to the listener, the speaker only testifies that p because she believes that p on the basis of a testimonial chain that started with the listener groundlessly testifying that p. Wright claims that the listener's epistemic grounds for p are not enhanced through such a circular testimonial chain, even if she has good reasons to believe that what the speaker says is generally true. However, internalist theories imply that the listener's epistemic grounds are enhanced, and therefore should be rejected.

Wright's argument against reliabilist theories is not intended to show that they should be rejected, but rather, that they should find a space for the transmission idea within them. His main claim is that unless they make room for the transmission idea, such theories fail to single out the relevant process that determines the epistemic status of a testimonially-based belief: Are the relevant processes those that (a) are involved in the production of the speaker's testimony, or (b) those involved in the listener's comprehension of a speaker's testimony? Or (c) both? Or (d) does knowledge from testimony depend on the reliability of either the former or the latter?[3] Wright claims that the reliabilist's first three responses (a-c) yield implausible results; and that while the latter response (d) need not yield an implausible result, the reliabilist has no way to explain when it is the processes involved in the production of the testimony, and when it is those involved in the listener's comprehension, that determine the epistemic status of the listener's belief.

Wright's suggested solution to this problem is based on the idea that it is the assumption through which the listener forms her belief which determines which epistemic grounds are those that secure the belief's modal profile and thereby determine the belief's epistemic status. Call this "the grounds-determination" claim. If a listener believes the speaker's testimony through an assumption that her comprehension processes are reliable, it is the reliability of her own comprehension processes that is relevant; but if a listener believes the speaker's testimony through an assumption that the speaker's testimony is reliably produced, it is the reliability of the production process that determines the epistemic status of her belief. This idea then provides a space for the strong-transmission idea to assert itself: When the listener's reason for believing a speaker's testimony that p is that the speaker knows or has epistemic grounds for p, and when the speaker testifies that p because she (or someone else) has epistemic grounds for p, then the listener's belief is grounded on the speaker's grounds for testifying that p. In such a case we can say that the speaker's testimony has transmitted those epistemic grounds to the listener, in the sense noted above: The speaker's epistemic grounds for p have become the listener's epistemic grounds for p, in virtue of the fact that they are the speaker's epistemic grounds for p.

This is surely an interesting and important suggestion, with implications that go far beyond the epistemology of testimony. Here I can only very briefly mention some of the considerations Wright brings in its support, and some possible concerns about his theory.

One thing to note is that what does most of the explanatory work within Wright's suggested account is not the strong-transmission idea, but rather the independent grounds-determination claim. The strong transmission idea is supposed to follow from the grounds-determination claim (when conjoined with other claims about the proper understanding of the strong transmission idea). But how plausible is the grounds-determination claim? If it does indeed allow Wright's theory to provide a better explanation of our epistemic intuitions about testimonial encounters than that offered by rival theories of testimony, then this should surely count in its favor. However, if the grounds-determination claim is true of testimonially-based beliefs, then surely a similar claim should be true in the case of beliefs not based on testimony. Indeed, Wright partially supports the claim by noting that when a listener believes a speaker's testimony through an assumption which is in fact false, the listener is committed to a falsehood, and thus "intuitively does not come to know" (p. 82). But this underlying intuition supposedly does not apply only to testimonially-based beliefs. Therefore, one problem with Wright's case for his theory is that even if he is correct about its explanatory virtues as compared to rival theories of testimony, this does not mean that it best explains the relevant epistemic intuitions: For the epistemic intuitions relevant to the principles underlying it are not limited to intuitions about testimonial encounters, but to knowledge and belief in general.

Once this is acknowledged, we can see that Wright's theory faces two kinds of problems. One is that the intuitive principle underlying the grounds-determination claim, namely, that when a subject's assumption commits her to a falsehood, her belief formed through the assumption does not constitute knowledge, is itself quite controversial. Consider beliefs explicitly-based on premises which happen to be false. This seems to be one way of forming a belief through an assumption which commits one to a falsehood (though believing through an assumption, Wright insists, does not need to involve explicitly and consciously inferring from the assumption). While it is arguably true that most beliefs based upon false premises do not constitute knowledge, it is far from obvious that no such belief can constitute knowledge. Indeed, epistemologists have described several examples of beliefs based on false premises that are safe, reliable or truth-tracking, and which intuitively seem to constitute knowledge (Adler 1996).

Another possible worry concerns Wright's claim (ch. 7) that his strong transmission thesis can avoid some of the objections to which moderate transmission theories seem to succumb. The problem is that the principles underlying his theory seem to support precisely the kind of moderate transmission theory which, Wright suggests, cannot avoid these objections. Thus Fricker (2006) derives the principle that L can obtain knowledge that p by trusting S only if S knows that p, from the intuitive principle that one does not obtain knowledge if her belief is based on a falsehood, conjoined with the claim that trusting S when S testifies that p commits L to taking S to know that p. If both Fricker's moderate transmission theory and Wright's strong transmission theory follow from the same underlying principle, Wright owes us an explanation why objections that supposedly undermine Fricker's moderate transmission theory do not undermine the support his own strong transmission theory receives from the same principles.

These possible objections should not overshadow the many merits of this short book. The book is bound to reshape the debate about the transmission of knowledge through testimony. It deserves the attention of anyone interested in the epistemology of testimony, and, indeed, as is suggested by the above discussion, of anyone interested in epistemology more generally.


Adler, J. E. (1996). "Transmitting Knowledge." Nous 30: 99-111.

Audi, R. (1997). "The Place of Testimony in the Fabric of Knowledge and Justification." American Philosophical Quarterly 34: 405-423.

Dummett, M. (1994). "Testimony and Memory." In B.K. Matilal & A. Chakrabarti (Eds.), Knowing From Words. Springer, 251-272.

Fricker, E. (2006). "Second-Hand Knowledge." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 73: 592-618

Goldberg, S. (2005). "Testimonial Knowledge through Unsafe Testimony." Analysis 65: 302-311.

Keren, A. (2007). "Epistemic Authority, Testimony and the Transmission of Knowledge." Episteme 4: 368-381.

Lackey, J. (2008). Learning from Words: Testimony as a Source of Knowledge. Oxford University Press.

Wright, S. (2016). "The Transmission of Knowledge and Justification." Synthese 193: 293-311.

[1] Wright characterizes this claim as moderate, to distinguish it both from the stronger version of the transmission idea, described below, and from a weaker and hardly controversial claim, that, at least sometimes, a listener can obtain knowledge that p by believing the testimony that p of a speaker who knows that p.

[2] It should be noted that Wright maintains that his transmission account applies to some forms of interpersonal interactions that do not involve testimony. However, the explicit and almost exclusive focus of the book is on the transmission of knowledge and epistemic grounds through testimony.

[3] While this problem is similar in some respects to the generality problem for reliabilism, it is, as Wright convincingly shows, a distinct problem (66-68).