Knowledge, Truth, and Duty: Essays on Epistemic Justification, Responsibility, and Virtue

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Steup, Matthias (ed.), Knowledge, Truth, and Duty: Essays on Epistemic Justification, Responsibility, and Virtue, Oxford University Press, 2001, 272 pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-195-12892-3.

Reviewed by Thomas D. Senor, The University of Arkansas


Knowledge, Truth, and Duty is a collection of fourteen essays by fourteen different authors. As the title indicates, the central topic is epistemic normativity and its relationship to the concepts of knowledge and justification, and to the twin goals of truth-seeking and error avoidance. The contributors are (in order of appearance): Susan Haack, Bruce Russell, Richard Fumerton, Carl Ginet, Richard Feldman, Robert Audi, Alvin Goldman, Matthias Steup, Marian David, Michael DePaul, Ernest Sosa, Noah Lemos, Vrinda Dalmiya, and Linda Zagzebski. With the exception of the papers of Haack, Goldman, and Sosa, these essays are making their print debut here. There is not space to adequately discuss each essay, so we will have to content ourselves with a quick description of each. After that I’ll take a closer look at one of the book’s central essays.

In her paper, “’The Ethics of Belief’ Reconsidered,” Susan Haack considers the relationship between epistemic and moral appraisal. After distinguishing five possible relationships between the two, Haack argues that the view that epistemic appraisal is but a subspecies of moral appraisal is false. For, Haack claims, if one’s evidence for p isn’t good enough, then one will be unjustified in believing that p. But a person “can’t be morally at fault in believing that p unless his belief is willfully induced” (p. 23). Yet that might not be the case; perhaps the person is intellectually deficient and cannot help but believe p even though his evidence does not support it—then his belief is epistemically unjustified but not morally permissible. Haack’s perspective on the relationship between epistemic and moral justification is captured in what she calls the “overlap thesis,” which says that there is a “partial overlap” and that “positive/negative epistemic appraisal is associated with positive/negative ethical appraisal” (p. 21). Her idea is that there are certain ways of being unjustified that bring along with them moral unjustifiedness. So a belief about, say, the current safety of my children that is formed on the basis of hasty generalization might well be both epistemically and morally unjustified. Believing in this way is a form of culpable ignorance.

Bruce Russell’s paper, “Epistemic and Moral Duty,” explores the same topic in a different way. Russell is concerned with the distinction between subjective and objective duty—moral and epistemic. Russell argues that knowledge requires the completion of both one’s objective and subjective epistemic duties. Borrowing from the work of Richard Feldman, Russell takes objective justification to require that the subject have good reason to believe the proposition in question; a subjectively justified belief is a belief that the person is blameless in holding. Russell uses this distinction to reply to examples of Alvin Plantinga’s in which a person has epistemically blameless true belief that is nevertheless not knowledge. These examples crucially involve a person’s holding a belief for which the subject lacks good reason. Russell takes these examples to show that objective justification is also necessary for knowledge. It is similar for beliefs for which the person allegedly has objective justification but lacks subjective justification.

Both Haack’s and Russell’s papers assume that epistemic appraisals are in some sense “normative.” But what is it for an appraisal to merit this appellation? This is the topic of Richard Fumerton’s paper, “Epistemic Justification and Normativity.” In the end, Fumerton can find no good sense of the term according to which epistemic judgments are normative. What’s the result of this? Fumerton claims that one potential implication is that epistemic internalists who criticize externalists for failing to fully appreciate epistemic normativity are off the mark (although Fumerton is sympathetic to other criticisms of internalists).

Part II of the book is entitled “Epistemic Deontology and Doxastic Voluntarism.” Carl Ginet’s fascinating paper, “Deciding to Believe,” kicks off this section. Ginet argues that while we lack direct control over a great many of our beliefs (i.e., that doxastic voluntarism is false regarding much of what we believe), there is a class of propositions that we can, in the right circumstances, come to believe “just by deciding to believe” them. The kind of case Ginet has in mind occurs when some doubt with respect to p comes up and one considers whether to believe that p, thinks that it would be better to believe p in these circumstances than to withhold p, and so decides to believe that p. To illustrate, Ginet offers the example of leaving home for vacation and then wondering whether the front door has been locked at the house. One might seem to remember doing it but not being completely sure. Nevertheless, given the hassle of driving the 50 miles back to one’s house, the good reason to think the door is locked, and the undesirability of worrying about it for the rest of the trip, one simply decides to believe the door is locked. Simultaneous with the decision is the forming of a disposition to “count on” p in deciding how to act in relevantly similar situations. Ginet recognizes that our having direct voluntary control in cases of this sort does little to motivate a general voluntarism of the sort that, for example, William Alston has argued against. Nevertheless, his article is noteworthy as a defense of even a rather restricted version of doxastic voluntarism.

No one has done more to defend the significance of epistemic deontologism against recent attacks than Richard Feldman. Here, in his paper, “Voluntary Belief and Epistemic Evaluation,” Feldman argues that a recent defense of doxastic voluntarism is flawed and that we lack the kind of control over our beliefs that we have over our actions, control that arguably is necessary for our actions to admit of deontological evaluation. However, Feldman argues that, as in the financial and legal domains, the “ought” of epistemology does not entail “can.” Just was we ought to repay our debt even if we are broke when the payment is due, so we ought to believe according to our evidence.

In “Doxastic Voluntarism and the Ethics of belief,” Robert Audi considers and then rejects arguments for two versions of doxastic voluntarism. Audi then considers the place for the ethics of belief in light of the failure of voluntarism. It turns out that there is a place for such an ethic but that the beliefs themselves are not the targets.

Alvin Goldman’s reprinted essay, “Internalism Exposed,” is the first paper of Part III, “Epistemic Deontology and the Internality of Justification.” Goldman is here interested in the motivation of internalism. The first rationale for internalism Goldman considers comes from what he calls the “guidance deontology” conception of justification. This is a long and rich essay that resists quick summarization. The bottom line is that Goldman finds internalism problematic because any way of construing “internal” that is sufficiently robust to guarantee that reliabilism is “external” has problems accounting for the justification of a whole range of beliefs—from stored beliefs, to beliefs originally justified by now-forgotten evidence, to beliefs about logical and probabilistic relations.

Editor Matthias Steup’s paper, “Epistemic Duty, Evidence, and Internality,” is a response to Goldman’s essay. Steup grants that the accessibility motivation for internalism leads to difficulties but argues one can motivate internalism by appeal to evidentialist principles. I shall have more to say about Steup’s defense of internalism at the end of this review.

Marian David’s paper, “Truth as the Epistemic Goal,” kicks off the fourth section, “Justification and Truth.” David’s paper is a thorough discussion of the relationship between justification and truth. In particular, David considers many possible variations on how to make explicit the “truth goal” (the goal of believing truth while avoiding error) spoken of by epistemologists of all stripes. In the end, David suggests a version of reliabilism that employs a subjunctive truth-goal (for every p, if S were to believe p, then p would be true, and if p were true, S would believe p) as the leading contender.

In “Value Monism in Epistemology,” Michael DePaul argues against the monism of his essay’s title. While some have claimed that truth is the only epistemic goal, DePaul claims that this can be seen to be wrong by considering that knowledge is better than mere true belief; true belief is be valued but not as much as knowledge is. There are, according to DePaul, a number of epistemic values—knowledge, truth, and justification to name a few.

Section V is “Epistemic Virtue and Criteria of Justified Belief.” These two papers seem somewhat thematically distant from their comrades. The first, Ernest Sosa’s reprinted “Reflective Knowledge in the Best Circles,” is concerned with, for example, how Descartes can noncircularly use what he clearly and distinctly perceives to show that God exists and thereby legitimize what is clearly and distinctly perceived. Sosa’s answer is the answer of the externalist: as long as the beliefs used in the proof arise from reliable (or “apt”) faculties they provide Descartes with non-reflective, animal knowledge. By using what we learn from our apt or virtuous faculties, we can achieve reflective knowledge by using our animal knowledge to construct explanations of how we know.

In “Commonsensism in Ethics and Epistemology,” Noah Lemos defends so-called “common sense” in both domains. He argues that beginning the epistemological enterprise with Moorean beliefs such as “I have two hands” is not objectionably parochial; furthermore, Lemos follows Sosa’s lead and argues that as long as these starter beliefs indeed have a positive epistemic status, they can ground our further beliefs—including our beliefs in epistemic principles.

The book’s final section focuses on virtue epistemology. Vrinda Dalmiya’s paper, “Knowing People,” takes its cue from virtue ethics and the method of care. While the notion of epistemic responsibility has a role to play, it is not simply the responsibility of standard deontological theories of justification. Rather the method of care centers the epistemic discussion on cultivating and reinforcing attitudes that are regarded as positive in the wider epistemic community.

Linda Zagzebski’s essay, “Recovering Understanding,” is an example of the way a virtue epistemologist evaluates and analyses an epistemic virtue. Citing the work of Plato and Aristotle on understanding, Zagzebski offers an account that takes understanding’s object to be structures of reality—that is, objects like pieces of art or buildings—rather than propositions that are the objects of knowledge. To understand is to comprehend these structures. Virtue epistemology, Zagzebski argues, is in a better position than non-virtue epistemology to give us workable accounts of subjects like understanding because the former but not the latter is able to accommodate both proposition and nonpropositional subjects.

If one is going to critically discuss a collection of essays in a short review, one will have to do so either by talking only abstractly about the collection as a whole or else by focusing on one particular essay. I shall do the latter. The remainder of this essay is a raises an objection to Steup’s reply to Goldman.

As mentioned above, Steup believes that one aspect of Goldman’s critique of internalism is correct: if the internalist starts with the accessibility constraint, she’ll run into problems. However, not all is lost for the internalist. She can instead motivate her view by adopting an evidentialist account of justification. Moreover, Steup argues, she can motivate her evidentialism by deontology. Steup notes that the relationship between the two is “complex” (p. 137) and that an adequate defense of it would be beyond the scope of his essay. He then gives a sketch of an argument that is prima facie problematic, but since Steup recognizes the sketchiness of his remarks on this score, I’ll not stop here to comment further.

What do we know about the sort of evidentialism that Steup prefers? Although he says rather little about the details, he makes two important theoretical points and then tells us a bit more when he responds to Goldman. Let’s look at these in turn.

Steup tells us that deontology leads to evidentialism. This is because no item can be that in virtue of which S is justified in holding a belief unless S is in “cognitive possession” of that item (p. 137), and the kinds of states that S possesses in the relevant sense are evidential states. So nothing is evidence for S that S does not possess.

The second theoretical point is that one need not have beliefs about what one’s duties are, still less beliefs about how one determines what one’s duty is. Saying he is taking a page from the externalist’s book, Steup maintains that justification requires only that a person has done her duty, not that she know she has done her duty or even be in a position to know it. “[A]ccording to evidentialism, having (undefeated) evidence for p is sufficient for being justified in believing that p. No further condition must be met” (p. 138). Now as it stands, this version of evidentialism would seem to have little to do with deontology. For as we learn a page later, Steup is willing to allow both stored and conscious beliefs to count as evidence. But then it looks as though if I have fifty beliefs that together entail p (and no set of 49 does), and I never put these beliefs together to see the entailment and am not being derelict in my failing to do this, I am nevertheless justified in believing p because I have undefeated (let us suppose) evidence for it. And this might be true even if my reason for believing p has nothing to do with my good evidence.

Let’s now take a look at how Steup’s internalism handles the problems that Goldman raises. The first Steup discusses is the problem of forgotten evidence. Suppose that Sally, an epistemically responsible person, believes that broccoli is good for her by reading it in the New York Times Science section. However, she later forgets where she read it and now only knows she believes it. Goldman claims that the person lacks an internal justification for her belief even though the belief is clearly justified and, if true, even counts as knowledge.

Steup replies that the evidentialist will argue that Sally does have evidence in this case: a memorial seeming. She seems to remember that broccoli is healthy; she also has a background belief that what she seems to remember is usually true. These comprise, Steup assures us, a good evidentialist justification for her broccoli belief. One point to raise here, it seems to me, concerns the epistemic status of stored beliefs. Steup allows these beliefs to play an evidentiary role in the justification of other beliefs. But in order for those beliefs to be justifiers, one would suppose, they must be justified themselves. So that should mean that stored beliefs, even when stored, are justified or unjustified. But then consider Sally’s broccoli belief before she remembers it, when there is no memorial seeming associated with it. One would suppose that if this belief will be justified when it becomes occurrent, it must be justified just before then. But then the justification of the belief doesn’t depend on the memorial seeming.

Be this as it may, Goldman foresees the move Steup makes and says that what this shows is that the kind of justification the internalist can get is not the sort that is crucial for knowledge. To see this, we should reconfigure the Sally case so that she initially forms the belief on the basis of what is known to be a bad source. So suppose also that she acquired this belief in a very unreliable way (and in a way she would take to be unreliable) and that she has not had the belief corroborated in the meantime by trustworthy sources. As with the original case, she doesn’t now remember where she came by the belief; she’s forgotten her source. Yet she has a memorial seeming and knows that she is a responsible believer who generally comes to her beliefs via reliable sources. Goldman claims that Sally is unjustified in her belief in the sense of justification that “carries a true belief a good distance toward knowledge” (Goldman, p 121). Steup rightly takes Goldman’s point here to signal a significant theoretical divide between them. Indeed, I think that this gulf generally exists between internalists and externalists about justification. The externalist and internalist will agree that knowledge requires justified true belief that also satisfies a fourth anti-Gettier condition. They will disagree, however, about how much work the fourth condition does. Traditionally, it has been the condition called on to show why Gettier cases are not instances of knowledge. Consider the following: suppose this were a world in which the demon is very effective at leading you into falsity but in which he screws up once and, quite fortuitously, you believe something true. Let this be a belief that we would typically count as justified—perhaps it is a standard perceptual belief. Is this a Gettier case? If you think it is, then you are likely an internalist who thinks that the fourth condition of knowledge has a lot of work to do. On the other hand, the externalist will typically say that there are no Gettier cases at demon worlds. Getting back to Sally, Goldman believes that the kind of justification that “carries true belief a good distance toward knowledge” is not had in a demon world; Steup and other internalists deny this. Is there any way of adjudicating this dispute without undertaking a general evaluation of the internalism/externalism controversy?

I believe there is. I think there is a rather sizable problem for Steup here; a problem that indicates that deontology and his brand of evidentialism might not rest together as well as he thinks. First, let’s consider the second Sally case from the perspective of deontology; and to do this, let’s consider a point in moral theory. As St. Anselm showed in Cur Deus Homo, the “ought implies can” principle fails when one is culpable for one’s inability to do what one ought. I promise to pay you back tomorrow the $100 I borrowed last week. In the meantime I’ve spent my entire paycheck on CDs, books, and beer; I have only $10 until my next paycheck in two weeks. I now cannot pay you tomorrow. Does that mean that I’m no longer have an obligation and hence will not be culpable for failing to pay? Of course not. My inability to pay today is explained by my earlier misdeed. There may a synchronic notion of doing one’s duty according to which as long as I’m doing the best I can now I am justified in acting as I do, but this is surely not the currency that standard moral evaluations trade in. We expect better of each other. Now I think that the epistemic deontologist should say the same regarding Sally. Sure, given that she believed irresponsibly in the first place and has since forgotten the ground of her belief, there is a synchronic sense of doing one’s epistemic duty in which her current believing is nonculpable. Yet since were it not for her earlier misdeed (believing irresponsibly) Sally wouldn’t now have the broccoli belief, and since all that has happened in the meantime is that Sally has forgotten the source of her belief (hardly an off-setting epistemic virtue), Sally must be judged to not have done her (diachronic) duty in believing as she does.

This result is doubly problematic for Steup. First, these considerations suggest that even if we are thinking of a deontological, internalist sense of justification, we should side with Goldman and say that Sally is unjustified. Second, and more significantly, the above considerations suggest that deontological considerations get on rather poorly with evidentialism. For what I’ve been arguing about the deontological evaluation of Sally’s belief is independent of considerations of the quality of her evidence. What seems clear from Steup’s sketch of evidentialism is that it is a synchronic theory: whether or not one is justified at t depends upon one’s evidence at t; and one’s evidence at t depends only on what’s happening at t. Here then is the big problem: deontological considerations generate a diachronic concept of justification but evidentialist considerations of the sort highlighted by Steup lead to a synchronic notion.

Despite its problems, Steup’s paper is a good read; it advances the internalism/externalism debate by showing that there are conceptual resources for resisting at least some of Goldman’s conclusions. (If evidentialism is unshackled from deontology there might well be sufficient resources for responding to Goldman). In addition to the Steup essay, of the previously unpublished essays, I found those of Ginet, David, Fumerton, and Feldman to be particularly thought provoking and insightful; but the overall quality of the papers is high. Knowledge, Truth, and Duty is well worth the time of any epistemologist.