Knowledge, Virtue and Action: Essays on Putting Epistemic Virtues to Work

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Tim Henning and David P. Schweikard (eds.), Knowledge, Virtue and Action: Essays on Putting Epistemic Virtues to Work, Routledge, 2013, 273pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415807692.

Reviewed by J. Adam Carter, University of Edinburgh


Tim Henning and David Schweikard have put together a timely and all-in-all very good volume of 13 individual papers, by senior stars as well as up-and-coming philosophers, on the theme of 'putting epistemic virtues to work'. The issues addressed span some of the most important topics in recent epistemology -- in particular, virtue epistemology, social epistemology and epistemic value; collectively, the papers provide a helpful picture of how mainstream epistemology has diversified well beyond just analyzing knowledge. In what follows, I'll outline (with interspersed critical remarks) the gist of each of the 13 individual papers, followed at the end by a few concluding comments.

John Greco, in 'Knowledge, Testimony, and Action', offers a virtue-theoretic approach to a dilemma he motivates vis-à-vis testimonial knowledge acquisition. As Greco suggests, a condition on testimonial knowledge requiring good inductive evidence seems too stringent in some cases (e.g., a mother telling her child there is milk in the refrigerator), while, at the same time, dropping this requirement would appear too lax in others (e.g., an investigator questioning a potentially uncooperative witness). So there's a dilemma: it looks like an adequate account of testimonial knowledge is impossible. Greco's way out is to reject the widely held assumption that either all testimonial knowledge requires inductive evidence on the part of the hearer, or none does. His rationale for rejecting this presumption draws from what he takes to be two distinct kinds of activities governed by the concept of knowledge: knowledge origination (e.g., uptake) and knowledge distribution. As Greco sees it, it's reasonable to suppose that the norms (e.g., quality control) governing originating activities differ from norms (e.g., easy access) governing distributing activities.

Greco's key move at this point is to claim that 'testimonial knowledge itself comes in two kinds' (21) insofar as it is sometimes serving the distributing function, sometimes the originating function. Accordingly, some knowledge-generating intellectual virtues will be apposite to one kind of testimonial knowledge, some to the other, given that 'what is required for reliable distribution is different from what is required for reliable origination' (23). Greco proceeds to show how this framework successfully resolves certain impasses between reductivists and anti-reductivists. It is an ambitious paper and one of the best -- if not the best -- in the volume.

Jennifer Lackey, in 'Deficient Testimonial Knowledge', takes as a starting point two 'extreme' views that arise vis-à-vis moral and aesthetic testimony. On the one hand, there are 'optimists', who hold not only that testimony is as basic epistemically as other sources, but also that the subject matter of testimony does not result in any epistemically significant differences. On the other hand, 'pessimists' hold that testimony about certain kinds of subject matter (e.g., aesthetics and ethics) is epistemically deficient or otherwise inferior to testimony about all other matters. Lackey's aim is to carve out a position in between the extremes. Drawing on her previous work on isolated-secondhand knowledge (2011), Lackey argues (convincingly) that the claimed epistemic deficiency in aesthetic and moral testimony cases is shared equally in certain expert testimony cases. Lackey claims that (contra pessimists) the testimonial recipients can in these cases gain knowledge even though, contra optimists, the knowledge acquired in such cases is not assertable or actionable and is as such epistemically defective knowledge. Lackey insists that the epistemic defectiveness cannot be explained as a matter of lack of (à la Sosa (2011)) reflective knowledge or (à la Kvanvig (2003)) a lack of understanding, leaving the right explanation an open question. While this is an excellent paper, I think there is room to press Lackey further on the matter of whether a lack of understanding could account for a good deal of the epistemic deficiency in the kinds of cases considered.

Schweikard's 'Responsibility and Others' Beliefs' focuses on the notion of epistemic responsibility, an issue he sets out to illuminate with reference to his discussion (which he uses as a continual reference point) of a case of a shipbuilder offered by W. K. Clifford (1879). Schweikard submits, and plausibly so from Clifford's case, that it 'seems promising to explicitly include the consideration of the stakes implied in a given situation in the characterization of epistemic responsibility' (59). Like Greco, Schweikard gives separate consideration to responsible epistemic agency vis-à-vis responsible recipients of testimony and responsible informants, respectively -- with a focus on the apposite stakes-sensitivity.

Thomas Grundmann's 'Doubts About Philosophy?' critically examines -- in clear and helpful detail -- a straightforward kind of argument for philosophical skepticism:

[1] If there is a genuine and roughly symmetric disagreement among epistemic peers (= GSE-disagreement), all parties are rationally required to suspend judgment;

[2] In philosophy, GSE-disagreements are widespread and stable.


[3] In philosophy, hardly any judgment can be rationally retained. (74)

Grundmann thinks the most plausible rationale for 'why GSE-disagreement requires us to suspend judgment, if it does' (75) will insist that GSE-disagreement generates for us a doxastic rebutting defeater for believing some philosophical proposition, and further, that we cannot escape from believing we are in GSE-disagreements about most everything. His key move out of the skeptical conclusion is to then argue (by way of a distinction between philosophical competence and veritistic competence) that we do not actually believe we are in widespread GSE disagreements among epistemic peers in philosophy. This is because, he claims, our regard of other philosophers as philosophical-competence peers does not involve regarding them as veritistic peers (or peers-vis-à-vis likelihood of getting it right). While Grundmann's proposal is an innovative one, his actual examples in support of this point (92-93) were not compelling. Bishop Berkeley, for instance, is a highly aberrant case, as he rejects a presupposition of most philosophical beliefs. As for Grundmann's example of David Lewis and David Armstrong, it's not clear that most wouldn't, in fact, regard either as a veritistic peer (or superior) in practice.

Jason Baehr's 'The Cognitive Demands of Intellectual Virtue' articulates a certain kind of 'cognitive requirement' on intellectual character virtues. Baehr's argument is situated within a 'two-tiered' psychological model of intellectual virtues. On the two-tiered model 'all intellectual virtues have in common something like a "love of truth" . . . but . . . each individual virtue has its own distinctive and more immediate focus or motivation' (100). Now it is suggested by some writers that the more specific motivations 'flow from' or 'are grounded in' the more general motivation. But what does this mean? Baehr's objective is to get clearer about the nature of this grounding. What he defends, to this end, is a kind of 'connecting belief' requirement according to which the agent, in order to possess some particular character virtue V, must also possess 'a certain belief about or cognitive perspective on the trait in question' (114), where the belief is that the V-specific activities are 'suitably related to S's more general epistemic goals' (101) and, further, that this connecting belief is at least a partial explanation of S's disposition to engage in the V-specific activity. Baehr defends this proposal against objections that have been leveled against an analogous kind of move in the arena of moral virtue.

Frank Hofmann's 'Epistemic Value and Virtues' engages with the virtue-reliabilist line on the value of knowledge. He constructs what he takes to be the VE 'master argument' for the surplus value of knowledge as:

(1) Knowledge is success (truth) from ability

(2) The relevant ability is a virtue

(3) Knowledge is success (truth) from virtue.

(4) In general, success from virtue has surplus value in comparison to success that is not success from virtue.

Thus, (5) Knowledge has surplus value in comparison to true belief that is not knowledge. (121-122)

Hoffmann argues that, ultimately, no plausible defense of this master argument is forthcoming. Unfortunately, he clearly thinks (2) is doing important work (and spends much of the paper searching for the right articulation of 'virtue' for the purposes of the argument). But neither Greco nor Ernest Sosa really need (2) in their argument for the surplus value of knowledge. The thesis that achievements have a value not shared by successes that do not manifest (or are not because of) abilities or competences doesn't rely on 'virtue' to do any work not done by their pet notions of ability and competence (respectively). To be clear, Greco and Sosa indeed help themselves to the familiar language of 'virtue' speak, but insofar as they are attempting to account for the special value of knowledge over true belief, they really are relying exclusively on insights about the normativity of performances with aims.

Ernest Sosa's 'Animal Versus Reflective Orders of Epistemic Competence' offers a rich and enhanced discussion of the competences involved in animal and reflective knowledge, respectively. Though his two-volume Locke Lectures (2009, 2011) provided a sustained discussion of this distinction, this paper goes a long way to help clarify certain difficult-to-process elements of his two-tiered view, and ultimately provides, I think, the most sophisticated (and satisfying) explanation to date for why his often-referenced 'kaleidoscope perceiver' case is one where animal knowledge (apt belief) is achieved but reflective knowledge (meta-apt belief) lacked. One particularly useful element of the chapter is his distinction between inner competences and complete competences, and further, what constitutes appropriate 'tests' for each.

Jonathan Kvanvig's 'Curiosity and the Response-Dependent Special Value of Understanding' constitutes a furthering of his case for the special value of understanding, as developed in his influential 2003 monograph. There Kvanvig argued that mainstream epistemology's 'myopic focus' on knowledge would be warranted only if knowledge had a special distinctive value, not shared by its proper subparts. But, à la the swamping problem, no vindication of the value of knowledge was to be found. However, a related state, objectual understanding, was claimed to possess the distinctive epistemic value often mistakenly attributed to knowledge, and this was said to be a good reason to give understanding a more prominent place in epistemology. Here Kvanvig picks up where the monograph left off and offers a further positive argument for the claim that the epistemic value of objectual understanding outstrips that of propositional knowledge. Kvanvig's rationale is, in sum, that understanding, and not knowledge 'drives the cognitive machine when curiosity is displayed' (171) in such a way as to motivate a response-dependent explanation for a special value possessed by objectual understanding and lacked by knowledge. Though Kvanvig's paper is characteristically sharp and provocative, I am left with an uncomfortable feeling: it seems that it's valuable epistemically to satisfy one's curiosity at least in part because it's valuable to understand -- a point which makes it seem at least prima facie problematic to, as Kvanvig does, account for the value of understanding in terms of the value of satisfying curiosity.

Christopher Hookway's 'Freedom of Mind, Self-Trust, and the Possession of Virtues' begins with a range of cases in which there is claimed to be an 'impediment to freedom of mind that has an epistemic significance' (177). His cases include that of an individual over-checking the time, whereby the individual is 'unable to avoid asking too many reflective questions'; in another parallel variety of case, agents are 'unable to ask (or take seriously) enough questions' (177-78). Hookway investigates how an absence of legitimate self-trust can explain the rage of cases featuring impediments to freedom of mind, and (in light of this discussion) concludes with a consideration of how certain intellectual virtues can be valuable vis-à-vis cognitive freedom. While Hookway's case that a lack of self-trust accounts for certain impediments to freedom of mind is a compelling one, his section on intellectual virtues at the end of the chapter could have benefited from a consideration of how self-trust itself might be understood as a character virtue.

Christian Nimtz, in 'Knowledge, Abilities, and "Because" Clauses', complains that '[Sosa and Greco] advertise their accounts as "virtue-theoretic" theories of knowledge even though the success of these accounts as theories of knowledge is, at least in one essential dimension, patently rooted in something non-aretaic' (204) -- namely, 'because' clauses. Moreover, sticking with these 'because clauses' will be to commit a 'serious methodological fallacy' (205), which Nimtz compares to that of identifying knowledge with 'non-accidentally-true belief' (e.g. Unger, 1967), an 'analysis' Nimtz rightly notes is more akin to a constraint than a theory. Unfortunately, Nimtz's discussion is far too quick. For one thing, Nimtz overlooks a lot of contemporary (and classic) discussion on this very point he is raising. Linda Zagzebski (1996) -- whom Nimtz doesn't mention -- defends the 'because' condition in her view against this very charge, and in a way that generalizes. Furthermore, because Sosa and Greco substantively cash out their 'because' conditions in their own ways, the claimed parallels between VE's reliance on a 'because' clause, and the non-illuminating 'non-accidentally-true-belief' account/constraint of knowledge are spurious. Finally, while Nimtz only discusses Greco and Sosa, he thinks his 'argument covers all virtue-theories' (188), and presumably he means virtue-theoretic approaches to analyzing knowledge. However, Nimtz seems unaware that moderate-VE (e.g., Pritchard, 2010, 2012, and Pritchard and Kallestrup 2012, 2013) is not a target for the kind of criticism he is making.

The point of Jesper Kallestrup and Duncan Pritchard's 'Robust Virtue Epistemology and Epistemic Dependence' is to highlight two pervasive kinds of epistemic dependence that stand in tension with the core dictum of robust virtue epistemology -- viz., that knowledge is a kind of cognitive achievement, creditable to the knower's cognitive agency. Positive epistemic dependence occurs when 'one's knowledge can be dependent upon factors that are completely external to one's cognitive agency' (211); an example here is that of the reception of testimony in favorable environments. Negative epistemic dependence occurs when 'factors that are completely external to one's cognitive agency can prevent one from having knowledge that one would have otherwise possessed' (211). Examples here are cases in which cognitive achievements that on RVE suffice for knowledge persist despite being unsafe on account of factors in the subjects' regional environment. Kallestrup and Pritchard rely on an 'epistemic twin earth' thought experiment (which they've defended in recent work (2012)) to bolster this point about negative dependence. All in all, the paper does well to highlight a serious tension between the core thesis of proponents of robust virtue epistemology on the one hand, and on the other the anti-individualist's plausible insight that what matters for knowledge doesn't supervene exclusively on properties of agents, but also partly on extra-agential properties of the environment.

Elke Brendel's 'Knowledge -- Safe or Virtuous?' takes a bold stand in defending safety as both necessary and sufficient for knowledge. One leg of the argument involves challenging arguments from Comesaña (2005) and others against safety as a necessary condition on knowledge. I more or less think Brendel's diagnosis of these cases is right. But Brendel also challenges, contra Pritchard (2009; 2012), the view that safety is not sufficient for knowledge. Pritchard's argument here relies on his case of 'Temp', who forms beliefs about the temperature in a room by consulting a thermometer that is (unbeknownst to Temp) broken -- though nevertheless -- there is a hidden helper in the room who ensures that whenever Temp consults the thermometer, the thermometer corresponds to the actual room temperature. Pritchard's (2012) line is that Temp has a safe belief that falls short of knowledge and, furthermore, that the best explanation is that Temp's correctness is not due to any ability he has. Brendel thinks the best explanation is rather that Temp is consulting a broken thermometer, and accordingly, the problem is the 'unreliability of the process type' (242). Pritchard could, of course, point out that the thermometer's being broken does not prevent the process Temp employs from being safe (given that the benevolent helper will be there in nearby worlds). A more general reply to Brendel though is that the Temp case is but one way to motivate an ability condition on knowledge. Brendel will need to do more to show that an ability condition is either not needed or will be subsumed de facto by a safety condition.

Henning's 'Knowledge, Safety, and Practical Reasoning' -- the final chapter -- argues that the notion of good information is often neglected in comparison with good handling of information, even though (in important respects) we're better off focusing on the former. One way of making this point is in terms of safety. Henning argues that traditional articulations of safety problematically 'relate to the knowing instead of to what is known' (248), and that we would be better off with what he calls a 'propositional safety' account, according to which 'P is safe for S, given S's evidence, iff there is no close possible world in which ~P that is uneliminated by S's evidence' (250). Henning goes on to argue that knowledge accounts of practical reasoning also would be improved if understood 'not in terms of predicates of subjects but of epistemic modal operators on propositions' (261), interpreted here along Yalcin's (2007) lines. This is a highly creative paper and does well to bring together recent work in several different areas. There are, however, problems with Henning's argument vis-à-vis safety accounts of knowledge. For one thing, what he is challenging under the description of safety is a flat-footed formulation; see Brendel's discussion in the previous section for a more plausible formulation. More importantly, though, Henning's propositional safety condition is too strong, for two reasons. Firstly, he's going to get the wrong result in Sosa-style rubbish chute cases. Secondly, an indirect implication of the view is that knowledge will require the elimination of what Pritchard (2005) calls 'reflective' luck -- but with this requirement taken on board, skepticism looks hard to avoid.

I'm of the school of thought that evaluating an edited volume is best done by talking about the particular papers in it, and then evaluating each of them. At any rate, that's what I've done here. But more general comments are also useful for purposes of perspective. I'll offer one negative general comment and one positive one. My negative general comment is this: it really isn't clear from the editors' introduction what the theme of the volume --'putting epistemic virtues to work' -- really means, and why, as the editors insist, the papers are united by this theme as they've sought to establish in their introductory overview. But, to stress, I don't think this negative point is very important. The papers in this volume speak for themselves. They are, on the whole, very good ones, and all are on cutting edge topics in mainstream epistemology. In the most important respects, then, the editors have clearly succeeded, and the volume receives two thumbs up.


Clifford, W.K., 1877 [1999], 'The Ethics of Belief', in T. Madigan, ed., The Ethics of Belief and Other Essays, Amherst, MA: Prometheus, 70-96.

Comesaña, J. (2005). 'Unsafe Knowledge', Synthese, 146 (3), 395-404.

Goldberg, S. C. (2009). 'Reliabilism in Philosophy', Philosophical Studies, 142 (1), 105-117.

Kvanvig, J. L. (2003). The Value of Knowledge and the Pursuit of Understanding.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Lackey, J. (2011). 'Assertion and Isolated Second-Hand Knowledge', in J. Brown and H. Cappelen, eds., Assertion: New Philosophical Essays Oxford: Oxford University Press, 251-276.

Pritchard, D. (2005). Epistemic Luck. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

--- (2011). 'Anti-Luck virtue epistemology', Journal of Philosophy, 109 (3), 247.

Pritchard, D. and Kallestrup, J. (2012). 'Virtue Epistemology and Epistemic Twin Earth', European Journal of Philosophy 21 (2).

Pritchard, D., Millar, A., and Haddock, A. (2010). The Nature and Value of Knowledge: Three Investigations. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Sosa, E. (2009). A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume I. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

--- (2011). Reflective Knowledge: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume II. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Unger, P. (1967). 'Experience and Factual Knowledge', The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (5), 152-173.

Yalcin, S. (2007). 'Epistemic Modals', Mind, 116 (464), 983-1026.

Zagzebski, L. T. (1996). Virtues of the Mind: An Inquiry into the Nature of Virtue and the Ethical Foundations of Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.