Kommentare zu Aristoteles, ›De partibus animalium‹

Denis Walter Image

Anonymous (Codex Hieros. S. S. 108) and Georgios Pachymeres, Eleni Pappa (ed.), Kommentare zu Aristoteles, ›De partibus animalium‹: Redaktionen zu Michael von Ephesos. Kritische Edition und Einleitung. De Gruyter, 2022, 375pp., $130.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783110708738.

Reviewed by Denis Walter, University of Bonn


The fourth volume of Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca et Byzantina / Series Academica presents Eleni Pappa’s inaugural editions of two distinct redactions of the commentary written by Michael of Ephesus (11th–12th century AD) on Aristotle’s De Partibus Animalium (PA). One redaction of Michael’s text has an anonymous origin (transmitted in the 13th century Codex Hieros. S. S. 108), while the other, more recent one is attributed to Georgios Pachymeres (1242–ca. 1310). Michael’s work stands as the oldest Greek commentary on Aristotle’s De Partibus Animalium. Pappa’s edition consists of prolegomena divided into 8 chapters and the two edited texts.

The prolegomena of Pappa’s edition include a well-documented introduction to the problem, in which she begins by delving into matters related to the transmission of Michael’s commentary and the two redactions. The manuscripts containing Michael’s work and the redactions attribute authorship either for all the writings to Michael or present them as anonymous (XXII). For this reason, an earlier edition of Michael’s commentary in the Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca (CAG) overlooked that a part of Michael’s commentary on the second book of PA is actually missing in the extant manuscripts (or was never written, XXVI; CAG 22.2, S. 25.3–36.11 on Arist. PA 646a8–651a35); and that this missing section was accidentally supplemented with a portion of Pachymeres’ redaction of Michael’s text, resulting in the CAG edition being a “hybrid text” (XXIII).

This first chapter is followed by a more precise investigation into the reasons that led to the hybrid CAG edition of Michael’s commentary with Pachymeres’ redaction. Out of the 99 pages attributed to Michael, 11 pages of the CAG edition are derived from Pachymeres’ text. Pappa provides a list of lemmata from both Pachymeres as well as the Anonymous redactions that fill the gap left by Michael’s commentary (XXX–XXXV). The third chapter is dedicated to the CAG edition and the corrections that should be made to it (XXXVI–XL). Chapter 4 is dedicated to the anonymous redaction of Michael’s text. The manuscript containing it, Anonymus Hierosolymitanus (Hieros. S. S. 108), thus consists of a redaction of Michael’s commentary on the first three books of Aristotle’s PA (up to 674a27). The editor also presents the diverse content of the entire manuscript which itself consists of two parts (A. ff. 1–89; B. ff. 90–191) that were originally created separately. The content of the codex seems to mirror the central scientific interests of the (probably) 13th century. It encompasses, besides the commentary to the PA, further biological and medical subjects in its first part and theological themes in its second part (XLVIII). Additionally, Codex 106 contains a detailed didactical program, likely identifying it as a handbook for the head of a school (LI). Chapter 5 is dedicated to Pachymeres’ redaction. Chapter 6 investigates similarities between the anonymous redaction and the scholia yet unedited in Parisinus gr. 1853 and Oxoniensis Collegii Corporis Christi 108, both listed by the editor (LXXVII– LXXXV). There also appears to be a connection between Pachymeres’ redaction and Parisinus gr. 1853 (LXXXV–LXXXVII). Chapter 7 explains the structure of the redactions and the methodology of the edition (LXXXVIII) and chapter 8 gives a short summary and overall conclusions of the discussion. The editions which follow this extended introduction are accompanied by three philological apparatuses: first, passages either directly excerpted from Michael’s commentary or paraphrased; second, the apparatus fontium et parallelorum; and third, the apparatus criticus.

If we turn to the methodology employed by the redactors, we learn that the anonymous redaction alternates between the Aristotelian text and the exegesis. Additionally, there is a significant update of Michael’s commentary, which not only comprises quotations of extended passages from Michael’s commentary, but also leaves significant portions of Michael’s text out, instead adding new individual exegeses. Furthermore, it refers frequently to other Aristotelian texts, cites from other authors like Galen, and includes examples from everyday life (LIII). Its marginal notes were likely intended to be an integral part of the exegesis (LVI). Pappa thus suggests that this text was intended for educational purposes (LV). Pachymeres’ redaction also introduces new lemmata, which are compared to Michael’s commentary, and offers novel interpretations, which constitute approximately one-third of the entire text (LX, LXIV). Pachymeres’ text is however solely concerned with Michael’s commentary on Aristotle’s PA up to III 2, 663a1–2.[1]

The endeavor to update Michael’s text with philological additions, references to additional sources, a revised Aristotelian text, and the limited distribution all suggest that the text was used for educational purposes within a limited circle of scholars (XCVIII–XCIX). As we see, however, both Anonymous and Pachymeres have engaged with Michael’s commentary in creative ways (XCIX). By undertaking to revise Michael’s commentary, the two redactions serve as witnesses of the scholarly environment and the scientific discussions which took place in Byzantium (C, cf. In Parva Naturalia (CAG 22.1, 142.8–15)). We further see that the redactions emphasize different subject matters. One example concernshow Anonymous explains PA 639a29. It seems not only to elucidate the content of PA, but also strives to convey systematic knowledge about fundamental Aristotelian terms as we see e.g., in the explanations of the meanings of synônyma and homônyma. Pachymeres, on the other hand, appears to presuppose familiarity with these terms and does not go into their significance. Another effort to expound basic Aristotelian philosophy is also apparent, for instance, in Anonymous’ commentary on 640a10. According to Anonymous, a correct scientific approach should first be concerned with an entity’s essence and only then investigate its becoming. Pachymeres, on the other hand, does not delve extensively into explaining these kinds of problems related to being and becoming, as he considers it evident (δῆλον) that becoming is dependent on form (εἶδος). Furthermore, Anonymous explicitly refers to Aristotle’s Metaphysics (*42 to 640a3). These brief examples indicate that the engagement with Michael’s commentary on PA is likely guided by the distinct interests and different reading strategies of the “editors”.

The choice of the edition’s title, Kommentare zu Aristoteles ‘De Partibus Animalium’, underscores the relative independence characterizing the engagement of the two redactions with the single commentary on PA written by Michael of Ephesus. The edition will be of value for the future research on the scientific landscape as well as the teaching methods and interpretation of ancient philosophy in Byzantium.

[1] However, Pachymeres engaged with Aristotle’s PA twice; besides this redaction, he employed it in his work Philosophia, which provides an overview of Aristotelian philosophy (LXVII –LXVIII).