Kripke: Names, necessity, and identity

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Hughes, Christopher, Kripke: Names, necessity, and identity, Oxford, 2004, 247pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0198241070.

Reviewed by Michael Nelson, Yale University


As its title no doubt suggests, Hughes’s is a book about Kripke. The book has four chapters, covering the main topics of Kripke’s epic Naming and Necessity (NN). Chapter 1 is on names; chapter 2 on modality; chapter 3 on identity, both trans-temporal and world; chapter 4 on Kripke’s anti-physicalism arguments. Hughes also draws from other of Kripke’s published works as well as unpublished lectures Kripke gave in 1978 on identity through time, the latter being very helpful for those who do not have access to a typescript.1

Hughes provides a very accessible and engaging presentation of Kripke’s arguments. While offering a balanced discussion of the issues, Hughes is not afraid to express and develop his own opinions on the topics. The book fills an important need, offering a good overview of some of the more important arguments Kripke has advanced.2 Anyone seeking an introduction to Kripke’s philosophy will be happy to find Hughes’s book.

Overall, I found the book to be uneven. The discussion of identity through time in chapter 3 I thought was excellent. The discussion of modality and the introduction to Kripke’s semantics for modal logic in chapter 2 were quite good. But other parts—in particular, the discussion of names in chapter 1 and of Kripke’s arguments against physicalist theories of the mind in chapter 4—I thought were less successful. Where I found problems, they stem, I think, from a lack of engagement with key pieces of the post-Kripkean literature. (NN, whatever else you think of it, inspired an impressive body of work from others.) Chapter 4 does not mention the important work of Bealer, Chalmers, Loar, and Yablo.3 Chapter 1 is silent on the important recent contributions by Soames and Stanley, as well as classic discussions by Kroon, Loar, and Yu.4 Now, as I hope to show, this complaint isn’t (merely) based on an untempered penchant for scholarship; Hughes’s discussion suffers from a failure to consider key points from this literature.5


Hughes makes a very important distinction between pure and impure descriptivism. A pure descriptivist claims that proper names are semantically equivalent to purely qualitative descriptions. An impure descriptivist appeals to what we can call anchors; that is, directly referential devices.

The difference between pure and impure descriptivism can best be brought out by considering a pair of responses to Kripke’s modal and semantic arguments. Say that two sentences s1 and s2 differ in their modal profile just in case there is a world w and context c such that s1 and s2 have different truth-values relative to c and with respect to (wrt) w. Then the modal argument can be stated as follows.

(M1) The modal profile of (n is a G) differs from the modal profile of (The F is a G).
(M2) If (the F) gave the content of n, then the modal profile of (n is a G) would not differ from the modal profile of (The F is a G).
So, (C) The expression (the F) does not give the content of n.

Rigidified Descriptivists (RD) object to (M1). According to a proponent of RD, the descriptive equivalents of proper names are rigidified definite descriptions of the form (the actual F). Rigidified definite descriptions, like proper names, are rigid. For any world w and context C, insofar as (the actual F) designates anything at all wrt w and relative to C, it designates exactly what it designates wrt wc and relative to C, where wc is the world of C.

What does this have to do with the pure/impure distinction? A proponent of RD, at least if we assume a standard understanding of how ’actual’ works, is an impure descriptivist. This is because ’actual’ refers, relative to a context C, directly to the world of C; it does not pick that world out by describing it in ways that do not presuppose its identity. For a proponent of RD, the actual world is given, if you like, in thought.

Let’s now consider a classical response to the semantic argument. Many have argued that a so-called causal description is guaranteed to pick out the intuitively correct referent of a name, at least if Kripke’s own suggestions about how the reference of a name is determined are correct. A causal description is a description taking the form (the entity standing in relation R to my current use of the name n), where R is a dummy for the correct account of the reference-determining relation.6 Now, a descriptivist who avails herself of such descriptions is an impure descriptivist, given that ’my’ and ’current’ seem to be directly referring to the speaker herself.7

The distinction between pure and impure descriptivism is a very important one, and Hughes is right to put as much stress on it as he does. However, on page 7, Hughes claims that Kripke’s intended target is only pure descriptivism and not impure descriptivism. If we so limit Kripke’s attack, then it becomes much less interesting. First, the vast majority of responses to Kripke (although, I hasten to add, not all) have involved embracing some kind of impure descriptivism. Second, and perhaps more telling with regards to speculations about Kripke’s intention, the views of many descriptivists that pre-date NN make explicit appeal to anchors and are thus forms of impure descriptivism. For example, Strawson’s reduplication argument, from chapter 1 of Individuals8 , is supposed to establish that thought about external objects requires taking as primitive (and we would now say directly referential) demonstrative reference to spatial locations. On Strawson’s view, one thinks about a specific individual by locating it relative to a demonstratively determined spatial location. Russell also appealed to anchors.9 On Russell’s view, we directly refer to sense-data (which are concrete particulars) and, if there is such a thing, the self, and then designate or “denote” other individuals by relations (mostly causal) they bear to those directly determined items of thought. On Hughes view, evidently, Kripke is simply not interested in showing that that these theories are false. I’m not so sure we should see such limits on Kripke’s goals. Others sympathetic to Kripke—for example, Soames in his (1998)—see no such limits.10

Let’s set impure descriptivism to the side. Hughes is pretty clear that he thinks that Kripke’s arguments are successful against pure descriptivism. Like Kripke, Hughes implicitly employs an assumption that some—in particular, Stanley—have argued against; namely, the assumption that necessity and contingency are features of the contents of sentences. With this assumption, one can legitimately infer that two sentences express different propositions from the fact that they have different modal profiles. (This is what supports (M2) of the above presentation of the modal argument.) But once this is denied, one can accept (M1) of the modal argument, not employ any directly referential items like an ’actually’-operator, and still claim to offer purely qualitative definite descriptions that have the same semantic content as names.11 Without a refutation of this sort of view, pure descriptivism is left as a live option.12

On page 16-17, Hughes offers an argument against pure descriptivism that I shall briefly discuss. The argument is reminiscent of Strawson’s reduplication argument already alluded to above. It turns on establishing a connection between a metaphysical principle—the Identity of Indiscernibles (PII), according to which, necessarily, [for anything x,y, if, for every qualitative property F, x is F iff y is F, then x=y]—and pure descriptivism. The argument is interesting, and deserves more discussion that I shall give it. But I think that Hughes’description of the case he considers suffers from a failure to give sufficient attention to the question of just what a purely qualitative property is.13 He considers two allegedly indiscernible mountains, one located in Belluno and the other in New Zealand. Now, unless Belluno and New Zealand are also indiscernible, the two mountains aren’t indiscernible. (The two mountains may be intrinsically just alike, but that doesn’t make them qualitatively indiscernible.) Be that as it may, I think that Hughes is right that a pure descriptivist is committed to PII, which, I think, is a serious (deadly?) cost. It’s just that we need a different case (maybe more like Strawson’s) to show it.

In §2 of chapter 1 Hughes considers the relationship between Kripke’s so-called Millianism about proper names and Frege’s puzzle.14 Hughes also discusses Kripke’s important ’A puzzle about belief’ (APAB). Hughes begins by articulating the apparent tension between Kripke’s Millianism, according to which names only refer to their bearers, and the non-intersubstitutability of proper names in epistemic environments (i.e., within the scope of an attitude verb like ’believes’). But Millianism by itself entails absolutely nothing about the intersubstitutability of proper names within attitude verbs. Whether or not names are intersubstitutable depends as well on the semantics of attitude verbs themselves. If we adopt what we can call a naïve view of attitude verbs, according to which they simply express, in an non-context-sensitive manner, a two-place relation between agents and the proposition expressed by the embedded sentence, then Millianism entails a substitution principle. But, as the work of Crimmins and Perry and Richard, among others, has shown, one needn’t adopt the naïve view of attitude verbs.15 A Millian can block substitution, should she so wish, and simply take on board the Fregean intuitions about the truth-values of attitude ascriptions.

In APAB Kripke argues that Millianism cannot be blamed for the apparently wrong results it may seem to entail regarding Frege-style cases, because we get the same “absurdities” without relying on the thesis of Millianism by describing cases in which, Kripke hopes, all will agree that the relevant names have the same semantic content.16 On pages 29-30, Hughes considers the following response.17 There doesn’t seem to be an unproblematic answer to the question ’Does Pierre believe that London is pretty?’, considered, as some would say, “out of a context.” By contrast, Hughes claims, there are unproblematic answers to the question ’Does Jones believe that Cicero was bald?’. However, this apparent contrast is false. Mark Richard, among others, has shown that all propositional-attitude attributions are “context-sensitive,” in the sense that their acceptability depends upon features of the occasion of utterance.18 Our intuitions of the truth of even an “unproblematic” attribution like ’Jones believes that Cicero was bald’ depend very much on the representational power of ’Cicero’, which is determined by—and can shift across—features of the occasion of utterance. The asymmetry Hughes points to is just that with standard Frege-cases it is only in rather contrived utterances that our acceptability intuitions flip.

Kripke’s is a puzzle of belief (or, more generally, propositional-attitude) ascriptions. But there is very little discussion of the semantics (and pragmatics) of belief attribution in Hughes’s discussion. There have been several attempts to offer general accounts that adequately deal with the phenomena to which Kripke draws our attention.19 I would have liked to see Hughes discuss some of this material. I think that it would have affected the conclusions he draws. Hughes argues that descriptivists cannot adequately account for the phenomena. But they can, if they are willing to accept certain semantics for propositional-attitude verbs. Indeed, I think that the puzzles can be treated while remaining more or less neutral regarding the semantics of proper names.


Chapter 2 begins with a very nice introduction to modal logic in general and Kripke’s semantics for modal logic in particular, including complicated issues concerning Quantified Modal Logic (QML) and Kripke’s counterexamples to the Barcan formula and its converse. Hughes then moves (on page 81) to a discussion of Quine’s attack on modal logic and Kripke’s response. This is what I shall focus on here. These are very complicated matters and I cannot give them the treatment they deserve. But I think that Hughes paints the wrong picture both of Quine’s arguments and Kripke’s relation to them.

Very roughly, Quine argued that QML made no sense because it required Aristotelian essentialism, according to which an object has an essential property independently of the way in which it is designated.20 And Quine thought all would agree that Aristotelian essentialism is false.

Now I don’t see Kripke as having “vigorously and effectively address[ed] Quinean worries about whether quantification into modal contexts made sense” (Hughes, p. 84).21 Instead, I see Kripke as simply accepting Quine’s charge that QML requires Aristotelian essentialism and responding “So what about it?”. Now granted, Kripke does better than Marcus, Smullyan, and Fitch, who also claimed that Quine’s worries don’t arise with proper names as opposed to definite descriptions, in that Kripke distinguished metaphysical and epistemic possibility more carefully and offered a general account of how ordinary proper names function the way they would need to for the response to work.22

In §2 Hughes discusses Kripke’s necessary a posteriori and contingent a priori. I shall discuss the necessary a posteriori when I discuss chapter 4; I shall briefly discuss the contingent a priori here. Like many, Hughes worries whether Kripke is right in thinking that the stipulator gains genuine information by her stipulative act about, say, the length of the stick she used to fix the reference of ’one meter’. I would think, however, that it is clear she does; she comes to know, by her stipulative act, that the stick is one meter (and this is a contingent fact that is about the world). Now she wouldn’t be able to pick that length out of a line up, as it were, just in virtue of what she comes to know by her stipulative act. But I don’t think that that is necessary for her to come to gain information that she didn’t possess before. (These, I admit, are again very large topics—and provocative claims—that I do not do justice to here.)

§3 of chapter 2 contains a very nice discussion of the essentiality of origins. Hughes persuasively argues that there is no general thesis regarding the essentiality of origins to be found—it depends very much on the kind of object under consideration. I found the section to be very nice.23


As I said in my opening, I found chapter 3 on identity to be the most successful. It contains an excellent discussion of Kripke’s fabulously rich lectures on identity through time. It also contains a nice presentation of the issues at stake in the debate between counterpart theorists like David Lewis and (what Hughes calls) identitarians like Kripke. Although chapter 3 is packed with interesting topics and claims to discuss, I have less to peck at and so shall be brief.

Hughes tries to draw connections between counterpart theory—a thesis about trans-world identity—and the doctrine of temporal parts—a thesis about trans-temporal identity. Others have also been drawn by such connections. I am dubious that there is anything but a natural affinity connection, as it were, and I was not convinced by Hughes argument for the connection on pp. 144–45.24 Like Kripke, I am fan of neither counterpart theory nor the doctrine of temporal parts; but I don’t think that all enemies can be so easily corralled into a single pen.


In lecture 3 of NN, Kripke offered an ingenious defense of the conceivability argument. The conceivability argument goes as follows.

(1) For any physical state p and mental state m, it is conceivable that a creature be in m without being in p (and vice versa).
(2) For any p, if p is conceivable, then p is possible.
(3) For any x,y, if it is possible that x exists without y, then x≠y.
So, (C) For any physical state p and mental state m, pm.

Kripke’s defense of (3), the Necessity of Identity, stems from his anti-counterpart theory. (1) is more or less taken as obvious, although others have tried to defend it by pointing to the “explanatory gap” between physical concepts and mental concepts. The novel thing that Kripke does in lecture 3 is to offer a succinct presentation of a common objection to the conceivability-possibility link of (2) and then go on to respond to that objection.

It may seem that there are many cases in which something is conceivability and yet not possible. Indeed, it might be suggested, whenever one is ignorant of an identity, an impossibility will be found conceivable. So, to take an example that Kripke himself discussed, even though it is conceivable that there be water without H2O, most of us agree that there is no such possibility. Conceivability is one thing and possibility is quite another, and there is simply not the strong connection between them that the conceivability argument requires.

For Kripke, that water is H2O is an instance of the necessary a posteriori.25 Because it is a posteriori, it may seem to be conceivably false. But Kripke denies this (precisely because he likes the conceivability-possibility link of (2)). According to Kripke, it seems conceivable because we misdescribe a genuinely conceivable situation as one in which there is water without H2O. But the description we give does not fit the situation conceived. Instead, what we are really conceiving is a situation in which there is stuff that has all the macro-properties of water, a situation in which we are interacting with stuff in our everyday lives that seems exactly (on the surface, as it were) like water, but is neither H2O nor, for that matter, water. Now this situation is also perfectly possible. What is really conceivable with respect to the separability of water and H2O is also perfectly possible. So, the necessary a posteriori that water is H2O is not a counterexample to premise (2).

Kripke concludes that standard cases of the necessary a posteriori are not counterexamples to the conceivability-possibility link of (2). He then argues that the strategy he employs to explain away the appearance of contingency were there is really necessity will not work to explain away the appearance to contingency in the case of the relationship between the physical and the mental. This is because that strategy relied upon exploiting a gap between how things seem and how they really are. (Stuff that seems like water needn’t really be water.) This gap, Kripke argues, is simply not present in the case of mental states (or at least mental states whose phenomenal properties are essential and sufficient, such as pain).

So far there is nothing in what I have said above that isn’t covered by Hughes. So why do I complain? Well, Kripke’s argument—and in particular his defense of premise (2)—has received much attention in the past 10 or so years that Hughes does not discuss.26 Much of the critical attention has accused Kripke of assuming, first, that all appearances of contingency must be explained away if they are not to be accepted and, second, that the only way to explain them away is to follow the model described above for water/ H2O. Critics have denied both. For example, Loar argues that we can offer another explanation of the (mere) appearance of contingency in physical/mental identifications by appeal to the kinds of concepts involved—on Loar’s view, theoretical and recognitional, respectively.27 Yablo seems to deny that we need an explanation. He claims that we should simply deny that, for every conceivable situation, there is a corresponding possible situation. The conceptual and the metaphysical do not, on Yablo’s view, so nicely fit.28 Chalmers defends Kripke on these points, although it is not at all clear that it is a defense that Kripke would—or even could, given his anti-descriptivism—accept.29 This is material that should be included in a discussion of lecture 3 of NN.

Although I have some qualms about Hughes’s book, I want to reiterate how valuable I think this book is. It provides a very accessible and informed overview of one of the most important philosophers of the later half of the twentieth-century. It is also extremely nice to read.


1. Kripke’s John Locke lectures on negative existentials, empty names, and fictional reference, as well as Kripke’s lectures on epistemology, both discussed by others in the literature although not themselves published, are not discussed in Hughes’s book. (See Salmon ’Nonexistence’ [Noûs (1998) 32: 277-319] for a discussion of the former and Lehrer Theory of knowledge [(1990) Boulder: Westview Press] for a discussion of Kripke’s objections to Nozick’s truth-tracking account of knowledge.) There is also no discussion of Kripke’s work on truth or Kripke’s work on Wittgenstein’s private language argument.

2. Of course, there are other monograph-length discussions of Kripke. For example, although somewhat dated, it is still hard to beat Salmon Reference and Essence [(1981) Princeton University Press]. Soames Beyond Rigidity: The unfinished semantic agenda of Naming and Necessity [(2002) New York: Oxford University Press] contains extensive discussion of Kripke’s arguments in the philosophy of language, but provides little by way of a discussion of Kripke’s work in other areas. (Soames’s more recent work on 2-dimensional semantics discusses Kripke’s view on the necessary a posteriori and metaphysical and epistemic possibility.) Greg Fitch has a forthcoming monograph on Kripke with Acumen Publishing that also promises to fill this gap.

3. See for example: Bealer ’The limits of scientific essentialism’ [Philosophical Perspectives (1987) 1: 289-365] and ’Modal epistemology and the rationalist renaissance’ [in Gendler and Hawthorne (eds.) Imagination, Conceivability, and Possibility (2002) Oxford University Press: 71-125]; Chalmers The Conscious Mind, chapter 4 [(1996) Oxford University Press], ’Materialism and the metaphysics of modality’ [Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (1999) 59:473-96], and ’Does conceivability entail possibility’ [in Gendler and Hawthorne (eds.) Imagination, Conceivability, and Possibility (2002) Oxford University Press: 145-200]; Loar ’Phenomenal states (second version)’[in Block, Flanagan, and Guzeldere (eds.) The Nature of Consciousness: Philosophical Debates (1997) MIT Press] and ’On David Chalmers’ The Conscious Mind’ [Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (1999) 59: 465-72]; Yablo ’The real distinction between mind and body’ Canadian Journal of Philosophy (1990) supp. vol. 16], ’Is conceivability a guide to possibility?’ [Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (1993)53: 1-42], ’Textbook Kripkeanism and the open texture of language’ Pacific Philosophical Quarterly (1998) 81: 98-122], and ’Coulda, woulda, shoulda’[in Gendler and Hawthorne (eds.) Imagination, Conceivability, and Possibility (2002) Oxford University Press: 441-92].

4. See for example: Soames ’The modal argument: Wide scope and rigidified descriptions’ [Noûs (1998) 32: 1-22] and Beyond Rigidity; Stanley ’Rigidity and content’ [in R. Heck (ed.), Language, Thought, and Logic: Essays in honour of Michael Dummett (1997) Oxford University Press, pp. 131-56], ’Names and rigid designation’ [in B. Hale and C. Wright (eds.), Companion to the Philosophy of Language (1997) Blackwell, pp. 555-86], ’Understanding, context-relativity, and the description theory’ [Analysis (1999) 59: 14-18], and ’Modality and what is said’ [Philosophical Perspectives (2002) 16: 321-44]. Kroon ’Causal descriptivism’ [Australasian Journal of Philosophy (1987) 65: 1-17); Loar ’The semantics of singular terms’ [Philosophical Studies (1976) 30: 353-77] and ’Names and descriptions: A reply to Michael Devitt.’ [Philosophical Studies (1980) 38: 85-9]; Yu ’The modal argument against description theories of names’ [Analysis (1980) 40: 208-9].

5. I must mention a related misgiving about the book: Hughes’s citations of text from NN are cued to its original publication in Semantics of Natural Language rather than the monograph publication of 1980. This is very unfortunate, as everyone uses the latter, given that it contains an important preface and addenda, and it is thus hard to find the relevant passages Hughes cites. Also, Kaplan’s ’Demonstratives’ and ’Bob and Carol and Ted and Alice’ are both cited as manuscripts when both of them have been published now for some time. (The former is published, with Kaplan’s ’Afterthoughts’ and a number of important papers on Kaplan’s work, in J. Almog, J. Perry, and H. Wettstein (eds.), Themes From Kaplan [Oxford University Press, 487-504 ] and the latter in J. Hintikka, J. Moravcsik, and P. Suppes (eds.), Approaches to Natural Language [D. Reidel, 490-518].)

6. See Kroon, ibid and Loar (1976). Loar said that this view is “the causal theory made self-conscious,” which nicely depicts the idea behind it. David Lewis also showed, in seminars he gave at Princeton, an affinity for the thought that this view offered a solution to the semantic and epistemic arguments. There are similarities between causal descriptivism and metalinguistic descriptivism defended by Bach (see, for example, Thought and Reference [(1981) Oxford University Press]) and Katz (see for example, ’A proper theory of names’ [Philosophical Studies (1977) 31: 1-80] and ’The new intentionalism’ [Mind (1992) 101: 699-718]). The most promising form of causal descriptivism, I think, offers a definite description that contains direct reference to a use of a name. (In my ’Descriptivism defended’ [Noûs (2002) 36: 408-35], I offer reasons for preferring direct reference to a mental dossier.)

7. There are ways out of this. For example, if one thought that de se thoughts were really self-attributions, as David Lewis argued, then one needn’t think of the speaker herself as being a direct constituent of the proposition claimed, by the above described descriptivist, to be the content of simple sentences with proper names. But there is still a sense in which the self is given and not described, because all thoughts are anchored to the individual thinker even if the individual thinker is not an immediate constituent of any thought. On page 13 Hughes makes a claim that may seem to show that such causal descriptions are impure even if ’my’ and ’current’ are eliminated. He writes that the description “’the individual who is called ’Gödel’‘ is obviously not an n-d-i free definite description.” (’n-d-i free’ is short for ’name, demonstrative, and indexical free’.) Well, in a sense this is true. After all, it has the name ’Gödel’ as a constituent. But, in the relevant sense, I think that Hughes claim is false. A descriptivist could be pure, in the sense that she maintains that all reference and thought about individuals is mediated by satisfaction conditions and that there is no direct reference, and still appeal to such meta-linguistic descriptions in offering her descriptive equivalents. Insofar as the pure/impure distinction concerns respecting or failing to respect this, such metalinguistic descriptions are pure-descriptivist friendly.

8. Strawson Individuals: An essay in descriptive metaphysics [(1959) Routledge].

9. In ’Knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description’[Proceedings Aristotelian Society (1911) 11: 108-28] and chapter 5 of Problems of Philosophy [(1912) Home University Library].

10. Although I am no fan of any form of descriptivism, I have tried to defend a form of impure descriptivism from Kripke and Soames in my (2002). In that paper I claim that Kripke’s arguments refute pure descriptivism. I am now skeptical of even that. (See below in the text.)

11. I think that the same results can be reached without following Stanley (who follows Dummett) in distinguishing the bearers of necessity and contingency from what is said. One does this by offering a non-standard account of modals. I try to develop (although I neither endorse nor accept) such a view in my manuscript ’Anti-essentialism, descriptivism, and the de re’.

12. What about the semantic and epistemic arguments, you ask? The epistemic argument is, I think, flawed on purely epistemic grounds, as it were. (See Jeshion ’The epistemological argument against descriptivism’ [Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (2002) 64: 325-45.) The semantic argument is, I think, the most challenging of Kripke’s arguments, and, I suspect, any force that the epistemic argument has is due to the insights that the semantic argument uncovers. In his (1999), Stanley tries to employ the distinction between partial and complete understanding—or levels of understanding—to build a pure-descriptivist kosher response to the semantic argument. I am not sure how successful it ultimately is.

13. Robert Adams, in his ’Primitive thisness and primitive identity’ [Journal of Philosophy (1979) 76: 5-26], does take this problem seriously.

14. The section also contains very nice discussions of the characterization of rigidity, obstinate and persistent rigidity, and de jure and de facto rigity.

15. Very roughly, Crimmins and Perry deny that attitude verbs like ’believes’ express two-place relations. They claim that the third relatum of the relation expressed is sensitive to differences between co-referring proper names and hence intersubstitutability is invalid. (See, for example, Crimmins and Perry ’The prince and the phone booth: Reporting puzzling beliefs’ [(1989) Journal of Philosophy 86: 685-711].) Richard develops a very rich proposal according to which attitude verbs express different relations in different contexts. The result is one in which intersubstitutability is invalid. (See, for example, Richard Propositional Attitudes: An essay on thoughts and how we ascribe them [(1990) Cambridge University Press].)

16. I assume familiarity with Kripke’s two most famous cases: the case of Pierre and ’London’/’Londres’ and the case of Paderewski.

17. It is unclear how much weight Hughes gives this response, but he never offers a rebuttal.

18. See the context-hopping cases in his Propositional Attitudes: An Essay on Thoughts and How We Ascribe Them [(1990) Cambridge University Press].

19. It should be noted that Kripke himself does not offer an account that adequately deals with the phenomena. Indeed, he seems to suggest that our belief ascribing practices simply break down, and seemingly because of the falsity of (what “appears to be a self-evident truth”) the Disquotation Principle, which allows us to move from what sentences competent and reflective agents accept to what they believe. This can hardly be a good account. Salmon, in his ’Being of two minds: Belief with doubt’ [(1995) Nous 29: 1-20], offers what I think is the best account of the phenomena on the market.

20. For Quine’s account of what he means by ’Aristotelian essentialism’ see, for example, ’Reference and modality’ [in his From a Logical Point of View 2nd edition, Harvard University Press 1980.] Note that on page 83 Hughes claims that what Quine calls Aristotelian essentialism is the thesis “that some of the properties of a thing are essential to it and some accidental.” This is not the view that Quine calls Aristotelian essentialism. Also, I talk as if ’a property had necessarily’ and ’essential property’ were interchangeable.

21. The quote continues by suggesting that “[t]hose of us who, as undergraduates, learned philosophy from Quineans think of Kripke as a philosopher who (almost single-handedly) transformed the philosophical landscape .” Now, granted, there is the phrase ’almost’ and the claim is qualified by what those who were taught by Quineans think, but Kripke is still given too much credit. (And I say this as a Kripke-fan.) There were others before Kripke—like Ruth Marcus, in particular, as well as Arthur Prior—fighting the good fight, and those roughly contiguous with Kripke—such as David Kaplan, Bob Adams, David Lewis, and Alvin Plantinga—who were also, in their different ways, fighting the good fight. Kripke was hardly single-handed in the remodalization efforts.

22. Kit Fine, in his ’The problem of de re modality’ [in J. Almog, J. Perry, and H. Wettstein (eds.), Themes From Kaplan Oxford University Press, 197-272], argues, quite persuasively, that QML does not require Aristotelian essentialism. Terence Parsons, in ’Essentialism and quantified modal logic’ [Philosophical Review (1969) 78: 35-52] also argues for this claim. But his theory has the necessity of identity, which requires just the form of Aristotelian essentialism that Quine found objectionable.

23. Not that I necessarily think that the conclusions Hughes reaches would be substantially different, but I would have been happy to see engagement with—or even just mention of—more recent discussions of the essentiality of origins by, for example, Graeme Forbes ’On the philosophical basis of essentialist theories’ [Journal of Philosophical Logic (1981) 10: 73-99]; John Hawthorne and Tamar Gendler ’Origin essentialism: The arguments reconsidered’ [Mind (20 00)109: 285-298]; Teresa Robertson ’Possibilities and the arguments for origin essentialism’ [Mind (1998) 107: 729-749] and ’Essentialism: Origin and order [Mind (2000) 109: 299-307]; and Nathan Salmon ’Modal paradox: Parts and counterparts, points and counterpoints’ [Midwest Studies in Philosophy (1986) 11: 75-120].

24. “The view that objects are wholly present in different worlds [the so-called identitarian view of trans-world identity] and the view that objects are wholly present at different times [the anti-doctrine-of-temporal-parts view of trans-temporal identity] are, as it were, made for each other, and someone who rejects one is well advised to reject the other” (Hughes, p. 145). Hughes’ argument for this claim concerns whether a counterpart theorist who claims that career-long co-habitation is identity (so, for example, that Gibbard’s Goliath is Lumpl) could say that how many objects there are on my table right now is a hard fact, and so does not depend on how things go in the future. Hughes argues that they cannot and then argues that its being a soft fact requires the doctrine of temporal parts. (I think that I am accurately representing the argument, but am unsure.) I think that both steps are false, although I admit that the matter is complex and I can’t do it justice here. Suppose that in fact the lump of clay and the statue are career-long overlappers. Then, according to the view under discussion, they are identical. Now sure, the statue could have, let’s say, gone out of existence before the lump had someone carefully squashed it into a ball. A proponent of (multiple) counterpart theory will say that this is because the one object (Lumpl that is Goliath) has two counterparts in a single world under different counterpart relations and those two counterparts are not career-long co-habitators. But why does that show that how many objects there are depends on how things go in the future? Further, even if it did, couldn’t an opponent of the doctrine of temporal parts also claim that what there is now depends on what happens in the future? I don’t see why such a dependence would require persisting objects to be stretched out across time, even if such a dependence would be more explicable if they were.

25. Another example that Kripke uses is Hesperus is Phosphorus. But, as Salmon has argued in his Frege’s Puzzle [(1986) The MIT Press], it is not so clear that such identities are really instances of the necessary a posteriori. Even though such identities are necessary, Salmon agrees, it is not clear that they are not known a priori. After all, we all agree that it is a priori that Hesperus is Hesperus; and if names are directly referential and ’it is a priori that’ is simple (i.e., nothing like the Crimmins/Perry or Richard view of propositional attitudes alluded to above is right), then so too is the proposition that Hesperus is Phosphorus, as these are one and the same. One might think the same thing about the proposition that water is H2O (namely, that it just is the proposition that water is water). This depends on whether one thinks that ’H2O’ is name-like or description-like. But even if one did think that, there are surely propositions that fit Kripke’s bill: for example, the proposition [if there is water, then there are hydrogen molecules].

26. Hughes does mention some of the prevalent physicalist responses to Kripke. In particular he discusses, first, the response, made by several, that attempts to employ the Kripkean strategy on the physical state as opposed to the mental state and, second, the response suggested by Thomas Nagel in footnote 13 of his ’What is it like to be a bat?’ and developed by Christopher Hill that attempts to claim that there are two kinds of conceivings—perceptual conceiving and sympathetic conceiving. (I should say that the first strategy seems to require invoking a magical kind of bizarre interference. Surely it is possible that there be a machine that accurately indicates our brain states. But then why would it be that that machine would inevitably be unreliable, merely giving the “phenomenology” of being in the relevant brain state, each time we imagine that machine giving the relevant reading and our not being in the relevant mental state? The second strategy, I think, suffers from a failure to fully account for why the mixture of these two conceivings results in conceiving impossibilities; especially when it seems that such mixings don’t always lead to conceiving impossibilities.)

27. See Loar (1997).

28. See, for example, Yablo (1998) and (2002), although something like the view seems to also be at some level present in Yablo (1993).

29. Chalmers relies on the two-dimensional framework, which is extremely incongruous with Kripke’s framework, as Hughes notes when discussing Stalnaker’s two-dimensional account of the necessary a posteriori on pp. 90-94. (Along with Chalmers, Hughes cites neither Jackson, Evans, nor (the arguable inventors of the strategy) Davies and Humberstone as proponents of the two-dimensional account of the necessary a posteriori.) Although myself not a fan of two-dimensionalism, I think that Kripke is right in his assumptions and Chalmers is right that the conceivability argument is sound. I also think that much of the force of Chalmers’s defense remains even after the two-dimensional framework is removed and a more Kripkean explanation of the necessary a posteriori is replaced.