Kritik von Lebensformen

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Rahel Jaeggi, Kritik von Lebensformen, Suhrkamp, 2014, 451pp., €20, ISBN 9783518295878.

Reviewed by Andreas Niederberger and Tobias Weihrauch, University of Duisburg-Essen


Jürgen Habermas has introduced his theory of communicative action as an attempt to overcome the aporias of the first generation of critical theory. Adorno's and Horkheimer's writings showed -- according to Habermas -- that any point of reference used to criticize the current situation turns out to be part of the problem. The proletariat had voted for the Nazis, modernist culture in its most avant-garde forms served to reconcile people with their capitalist living conditions, and one could even read the seemingly least practical and abstract philosophical theories as preparing and maintaining a form of subjectivity that dominates nature, oneself and others. In Habermas' view the task of the next generations of critical theory was, thus, to detect standards that would allow identifying the contradictions and crises of current societies, while, at the same time, providing societies with an orientation for their possible transformation.

Rahel Jaeggi's new book Kritik von Lebensformen (Critique of Life Forms) must be read in light of this task. Dissatisfied with Habermas' ultimately Kantian transcendental project of identifying formal conditions of possibility for successful discourses, but also with Axel Honneth's return to a substantial Hegelian theory of ethical life (Sittlichkeit), Jaeggi suggests a third way, maneuvering between the other two approaches. She agrees with Honneth that the critique should be immanent, assuming that the addressees of the critique are ultimately those who are also its subjects. But following Habermas she hesitates to endorse possibly problematic existing beliefs, decisions, and life forms. Jaeggi, therefore, identifies a formal element within life forms, namely their ability (or inability) to learn from difficulties and in crises, as their crucial dimension for the paradoxes they engender and their means of overcoming them -- and this means for their greater or lesser potential for rationality and rationalization.

The book contains four parts and a longer introduction. In the introduction Jaeggi reminds the reader that contemporary philosophy strongly opposes questions of the good life and instead typically focuses on rightness or justice. Modern society has generated individualism, pluralism, and reflexivity, and also the normative notions of autonomy, self-determination and self-realization. We are supposed to bracket our own traditions and life form to promote or at least accommodate ourselves to the heterogeneity of competing life forms. This "liberal self-restraint" (30) has the consequence that life forms (and this also means autonomy and self-realization, which are particular life forms themselves) cannot serve as reference points for rational transformations or evaluations any more. However, instead of focusing on formal or procedural features of life forms or their generation as loci of rationality, Jaeggi suggests that we should look closer at life forms in their materiality and at the specific norms they entail. Despite their irreducibly heterogeneous character and the contingency of their emergence, they display different abilities to cope with crises and to learn from their difficulties when reacting to new contexts (58). This allows for the identification of potentials of rationality in life forms -- and moreover it allows us to show that rational transformations ultimately depend on specific life forms. Rationality enables agents to transcend life forms to some degree, but agents can only act rationally, if they are already embedded in a life form that provides them with the means to react in a rational way.

In the first part of the book Jaeggi examines the notion of life forms in our everyday life and develops a modular concept of it. She distinguishes the concept of a life form from notions of lifestyle, habit, individual morals and customs. Life forms are bundles of social practices and orientations comprising attitudes and habitualized dispositions to a certain behavior. They involve normative requirements with regard to the social group, even though they are neither strictly codified, nor institutionally obligatory (77). And even though life forms are products of human thought and agency, which is why they can be changed, they are resilient in the sense that they provide agents with default options of how to act and react in given situations. Since they are, thus, much more deeply constitutive for social practices than lifestyles etc., which can easily be given up, we must and should consider them in light of their success and rationality in dealing with new situations. And unlike lifestyles etc., which are ultimately a matter of choice, life forms internally raise claims to success and rationality.

The second part of the book looks more closely at these internal normative claims of life forms: life forms claim to provide agents with strategies for coping with problems. Given this assertion, life forms offer participants and observers alike a criterion of their validity, namely their ability to solve the problems they pretend to solve. Since life forms are particular ways of defining and framing problems, the problems are not "objective" in the sense that one could compare different solutions various life forms offer for the same problem. Nevertheless one can identify a functional level, on which different life forms must react to similar functional challenges (214-216). Life forms might define (especially normative) problems in very different ways, and these definitions cannot be simply translated into one another. But these definitions cannot "define away" functional requirements. Jaeggi suggests that we can detect different rationalities of life forms in the mechanisms they offer to revise their definition and framing of problems and the finding of respective solutions, when given ways of understanding the world functionally fail. And these differences between life forms are normative differences, because they concern the internal normative requirements and expectations of life forms to adapt to functional challenges (227).

Given the dependence of problem definitions and their solutions on always already existing life forms, one wonders how agents could ever change or give up their life form and "choose" a more rational way of dealing with problems. In the third part of the book Jaeggi explores, therefore, the ways in which criticism of life forms can be formulated and from what standpoint. She develops a model of immanent critique and rejects internal and external approaches to it. The model of critique Jaeggi recommends cannot be an external one, since an external criticism would not take into account the dependency of conditions of rationality on a life form and its resilient character. But, on the other hand, the critique can also not be internal, because it would not provide the tools necessary to analyze and overcome the internal contradictions of a life form, which are often the reasons and origins of crises.

Jaeggi's model of immanent critique is inspired by Hegel, but it does not – unlike Hegel and more recently Honneth -- reconstruct the primary normativity inherent in life forms to reactualize the forgotten or covered normative core of existing social practices. Picking up on critiques of ideology, Jaeggi's version of immanent critique relates to the potential of rationality inherent in life forms to revise themselves in situation of crises by reconsidering their own resources and by opening themselves up to other life forms. The critique highlights parallel contradictions between reality and norms (293). Given their own claims to validity, life forms must react both to tensions between the reality and their norms (the fact that the reality is not shaped according to the norms) and to those between their norms and the reality (the fact that agents cannot implement the norms). The transformative power of immanent critique resides, thus, in mobilizing the potential inherent in life forms to reflect on and react to the double tension -- and this means to analyze the difficulties in the application of the norms and to reconsider them. Unlike Honneth, for instance, Jaeggi does not focus on single values embodied in life forms, but on the way the life forms relate to their different and heterogeneous values in situations of crisis. Transformative critique can thus transform the norm and the related practice instead of restoring the current order or adopting the practice as it fits to the initial meaning of the norm.

By pointing to experience and learning, Jaeggi's model of immanent critique refers to the dynamic of innovation in problem solving, which we can detect in life forms. In the fourth and final part of the book she uses her concept of a life form and the idea of immanent critique to develop a scheme of different learning processes and their failures. Critique of life forms consists, thus, in stressing difficulties, irrationalities, contradictions and dysfunctionalities that life forms display when dealing with challenges and crises. The standard a critical theory of society could and should refer to is in this view the emancipatory possibilities different life forms offer in the way they enable learning and transformation processes. The standard, thus, is neither external -- as in Habermas' neo-Kantian procedural account -- to the material perspective of the agents themselves, nor does it endorse any specific material value -- as in Honneth's neo-Hegelian approach. Emancipation can only be brought about from within life forms, but ultimately emancipation consists in a collective self-determination, which is not bound by contingent limits life forms set (446).

Jaeggi offers an interesting new attempt to fulfill the task Habermas has set for critical theory. She recommends accepting the plurality of life forms and the fact that they are unavoidable in their particular features for the development of normative standards and for the exercise of rationality. Nevertheless we can still uphold a general ideal of emancipation and judge the different contributions of different life forms to a more rational world, if we consider the abilities of life forms to learn from crises and to transform themselves accordingly. Emancipation will, thus, not be an emancipation from life forms -- we will necessarily be bound to the contingencies of certain life forms, which have historically emerged -- but we can strive for (more) emancipatory life forms.

How convincing is this new answer to Habermas' challenge? There are at least three problems with Jaeggi's perspective. First, the concept of life form remains too vague. Jaeggi is clearly aware of the difficulties easy references to the black box notion of "social practices" pose. The notion is interesting, because it allows for the inclusion of some kind of social reality, which cannot be reduced to ad hoc interactions and individual intentions to cooperate. At different points in the book Jaeggi highlights the interrelation between attitudes and beliefs of participants, on the one hand, and actions and interactions in relevant contexts, on the other hand (for instance, 104-106). But this interrelation raises important questions: are the attitudes and beliefs, which are constitutive for life forms, resilient, or the actions and interactions -- or the interrelation itself? In all three cases it is not clear why and when they are resilient and why this resilience should be a factor for agents. It would have been desirable to get a clearer explanation of the concept of social practices, which is so important for Jaeggi's concept of a life form -- and for the possibilities of transforming, newly creating or even overcoming life forms.

This issue already points to a second criticism: how rational is the rationality Jaeggi discovers in the learning abilities of different life forms? Can we really expect emancipation to result from this rationality? If there are no further criteria for the acceptability or unacceptability of life forms than their learning abilities, we might have to accept oppressive life forms, if they meet certain criteria of self-reflexivity and solve crises in adequate ways. This certainly cannot be satisfying for a critical theory.

And even if the reference to rationality were sufficiently convincing, a third criticism would arise: Jaeggi detects potentials of rational development in life forms, but if the rationality of life forms depends on their way of dealing with problems, it is important to know who articulates the problems and who learns in which way from their solutions. It is unclear in Jaeggi's analyses, if life forms as collective agents learn as individuals do. She states that it is "unsatisfactory" (328) that we have to assume that the learning processes of life forms can either be pictured as aggregations and therefore be reduced to individuals or that we must conceive of the "learner" as some kind of collective subject. Since Jaeggi rejects the latter idea as "unsuitable," only the first option of reducing aggregated conditions to individuals remains. The process of overcoming crises, however, is compared to an evolutionary process,where the better option for solving a problem and overcoming the crisis survives. How should we think of such a process, if we do not conceive of it in terms of a collective action or a common intellectual effort? In summary, one can, therefore, say that Jaeggi offers an interesting new perspective in critical theory's pursuit of a standard for evaluating the development and potentials of society -- but it remains too much of an idea of how to do critical theory differently that still needs to be anchored in a theory of society.