Kuhn's Evolutionary Social Epistemology

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K. Brad Wray, Kuhn's Evolutionary Social Epistemology, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 229pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107012233.

Reviewed by Rogier De Langhe, Tilburg University (TiLPS)


Thomas Kuhn's work occupies a strange place in the history of philosophy. With over one million copies sold, Kuhn's Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962) is probably the most popular academic philosophy book of the twentieth century. Yet, despite its intuitive appeal Kuhn's work has been received very critically by philosophers themselves. Almost fifty years later, Brad Wray wants to move past the popular negative reading of Kuhn and searches for positive insights in his work.

According to Wray, Kuhn has so often been misunderstood because he was working within an entirely different conception of philosophy of science, characterized by an alternative research agenda and, as a result, different standards of adequacy than those traditionally used to judge contributions to the philosophy of science. Wray presents Kuhn as offering a genuinely new framework for philosophy of science. This paradigm is an evolutionary and social epistemology, as in the book's title.

The characterization of this project is the red line through the book, which consists of three parts. In the first part Wray uses his view of Kuhn's work as an evolutionary and social epistemology to give a coherent and insightful interpretation of key Kuhnian concepts such as "paradigm", "revolution" and "incommensurability". This conceptual clarity provides a firm footing for the characterization of the evolutionary and social dimension of Kuhn's epistemology in parts two and three of the book respectively.

In order to position Kuhn's project against other projects and present it as genuinely different, Wray contrasts it with "the traditional philosophical project" (181) with its focus on the individual and an often exclusive interest in the relation between evidence and theory. Wray insists that this narrow view is bound to miss important aspects of the process of theory change. But most importantly Kuhn is also positioned against the Strong Programme in the sociology of science to which he has often -- much to his own dismay -- been linked. Wray argues that Kuhn’s view is not to be identified with the Strong Programme because he is not an externalist and his nominalism is not of the radical kind. (154-64)

Nevertheless the sociology of science has an important role to play in an evolutionary, social epistemology. One of the main points of the book is that some social factors, most notably specialization, can be epistemic. Increased accuracy does not mean a theory is getting closer to the truth but is a result of increased specialization that allows scientists to isolate themselves from neighboring disciplines and develop specialized instruments and conceptual tools; "specialization fills the part played by truth in traditional philosophical accounts of science." (88) The sociology of science, then, is an important source of empirical material to better understand the social changes that constitute theory change. As an exemplar, Wray presents the case of plate tectonics to show in what sense empirical data from sociology can be used to gain a better philosophical understanding of how one theory gets replaced by another.

One of the main ways in which Kuhn has been misunderstood is in how he uses social and historical factors. This is often thought to indicate that Kuhn thinks theory acceptance is guided by factors external to science (externalism). However, Wray shows that Kuhn is only interested in social and historical factors insofar as they are epistemic. This can be understood by realizing Kuhn's epistemology is evolutionary. What questions are relevant questions and what answers count as suitable is not given by the world but results from previous scientific investigation. (113) As a consequence, the goals of science are produced by previous research (historical) done by others (social) rather than given by nature. Science is not a process drawn ever closer to the truth but a process of increasing specialization.

The role of specialization in Kuhn's work has received little treatment and even Kuhn himself never dedicated a full paper to the subject. Wray is one of the first to integrate specialization into an interpretation of Kuhn, and does so to great effect. (117-36) Wray shows that specialization can play a key role as a bridge between the social and the epistemic. On the one hand specialization is a social phenomenon (specialization is only possible if there are multiple scientists to divide labor over), but on the other hand it is the direct cause of increased accuracy. The progress of science might as well be described as a history of the increased specialization of science. Hence the locus of scientific change is no longer the individual but the research community. (43) Kuhn's description of the barriers of communication between neighboring specialties has been perceived by many as impediments to scientific progress. By contrast, on Wray's view these barriers are essential for scientific progress because they make possible the specialized communities that are responsible for the development of science. Wray backs up his surprising view on specialization with two case-studies of specialty formation, virology and endocrinology.

Wray describes science as a process with a moving target, not teleological but driven from behind. Parallel to the reception of Darwin, philosophers have found especially this non-teleological aspect very hard to swallow. It is difficult to make sense of within a framework consisting only of statements and their relation to the world. However, once one recognizes that the realm of the epistemic encompasses not only the relation of theory to evidence but that evidence only acquires meaning within a changing social context, it is clear that this does not undermine the integrity of science. What changes through time is not the facts themselves but their significance. This is beautifully illustrated by the seventeenth-century debate about buoyancy. (107-110) Galileo maintained that buoyancy did not depend on the shape of the object, but his adversaries produced an experiment that showed that a sphere of ebony would sink while a thin piece of the same material would remain afloat. In response to this surprising result Galileo was forced to qualify the intended scope of his theory of buoyancy to the extent that it rendered his adversaries' results irrelevant. He restricted his theory to the behavior of bodies in water, and not on the water's surface. This illustrates that the significance of facts can change as a result of theoretical developments.

Throughout the book Wray deals with some persistent myths, misunderstandings and mistakes in Kuhn's philosophy, based on a reading of Kuhn's much less popular later work and informed by empirical results from sociology. For example, Kuhn later retracted the metaphor of the "gestalt switch" as a metaphor for paradigm shifts because a gestalt switch is an individual experience while for Kuhn the locus of paradigm change is the scientific community. (15) Furthermore, recent sociological research suggests that Kuhn's hypothesis that paradigm change is led by the younger and resisted by the older does not hold water. (187-8) Kuhn is not an externalist nor a radical nominalist as is often thought, and he should therefore not be associated with the Strong Programme in the sociology of science. (154-64) Wray also denies that for Kuhn rationality is subjective and that science is not distinguishable from other cultural products. (164)

In sum, the book presents a theoretically mature interpretation of the work of Thomas Kuhn. Its originality comes from the articulation of the alternative research agenda embodied in Kuhn's work and the fact the author does this by drawing on often-neglected material, such as Kuhn's much less popular later work and empirical results from the sociology of science. Most importantly, Wray shows that specialization can function as a bridge between the epistemic and the social. The insight that the social can be epistemic and the epistemic is sometimes social might prove to be the key to a synthesis of the projects of traditional philosophy of science and sociology of science. Moreover, the book already contains a number of contributions to the very research project it describes, such as a novel treatment of the Copernican revolution (34-47), a critical assessment of the influence of age on theory choice (187-8) and a case-study of plate tectonics, using empirical data from sociology to gain a better understanding of how exactly one theory is replaced by another. (186-200) It is therefore fair to say that this book is well under way to become an exemplar of the very research project it describes.