La raison des normes: Essai sur Kant

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Jean-François Kervégan, La raison des normes: Essai sur Kant, Vrin, 2015, 192pp., $13.52 (pbk), ISBN 9782711625918.

Reviewed by Terry Pinkard, Georgetown University


In France, Jean-François Kervégan is widely respected as one of the leading figures working on German idealism, and is especially known for his work on Hegel. He is also known for his work in legal and political philosophy (in which he displays some affinities with the "Frankfurt school"). His latest book is a short monograph on Kant's practical philosophy. It is a close reading of Kant that is supposed to underwrite an ambitious philosophical thesis.

The core idea is that Kant is much more attuned to the fine-grained sense of the social and the empirically practical than he has been given credit for, but that this does not mean that we should jettison the Kantian metaphysics, nor that we should somehow deflate its main claims to make it more palatable to contemporary tastes. In developing his case, Kervégan makes the center of gravity Kant's 1797 Metaphysics of Morals and Kant's writings that are contemporary with it or follow it in time. This move is linked to one of the big theses of this short book, namely, that there is a decisive shift in Kant's views after 1788 about how to think of practical reason itself. This is, so the thesis goes, not so much because Kant changed his mind but because he finally saw a better way to articulate his deeper views about practical reason as they had emerged in the first Critique of 1781. To show that there is both a decisive difference and nonetheless a deep continuity of Kant's work from the first period (roughly, from the first to the second Critique) with that of the second period, Kervégan focuses at the end of his monograph on Kant's very short 1784 essay on the philosophy of history. For Kervégan, the role that autonomy plays in the Kantian system has been severely overestimated.

A number of arguments that Kervégan makes in the book reach conclusions that will not be surprising to Kant scholars in the Anglophone world. Kant's formalism is, he says, only a "legend" that ignores the way in which the categorical imperative is not a principle from which one should expect to deduce the concrete maxims of actions but is really only a test to show what maxims (and not which intentions) are normatively valid. The categorical imperative is thus a "procedural" idea. (p. 82) He argues that the development of Kant's views show that as the emphasis on autonomy fades in his later writings, the troubling view of the will's special form of causality also recedes from view as Kant comes to rest his case on the distinction between will and the power of choice (i.e., between Wille and Willkür). The autonomy of the will, Kervégan argues, "is not the source of norms; it is only the source of their obligatory character (Verbindlichkeit) which it presents when they [those norms] are valid." (p. 72) He also spends time debunking the idea that the real choice of interpretive frameworks for Kant's philosophy are the either/or of deontology versus consequentialism (although he does conclude that Kant is nonetheless a "weak" deontologist of a sort, but certainly not somebody who ignores the consequences of our maxims). Although these conclusions will not come as a great shock to Anglophone Kantians, Kervégan has nonetheless provided another set of arguments for this way of reading Kant.

What does distinguish Kervégan's reading from so many of the "proceduralist" Anglophone interpretations is his insistence on maintaining a determinedly metaphysical interpretation of the critical philosophy. Pure practical reason should be construed not as producing norms or of coming to know norms that are independently valid but instead as "recognizing" norms. The categorical imperative is thus more like Hart's "rule of recognition" than it is a material principle on its own. It is a "second-order reason" ruling some things in, some things out. However, unlike Hart's conception of the rule of recognition, the categorical imperative is not merely a feature of social custom but is a priori and constitutive of practical reason itself, and this is what Kant means by the "fact of reason." (p. 67) It is a procedural idea that tests the acceptability of norms that make claims to being true or valid, and it is thus is the most general "rule" that specifies two divisions to itself -- ethics and the juridical (juridicité) -- that do not stand in any kind of hierarchy to each other. The specific shape that normativity in general takes is that of legislation in terms of pure concepts of nature (the normativity of "the understanding" and of its rules vis-à-vis possible experience) and in terms of the legislation by the concept of freedom (that is, the normativity of reason and its principles vis-à-vis actions and their maxims). (p. 146) It is also a fundamental mistake to identify the difference between legality and morality with that between ethics and the juridical, even though Kant himself sometimes writes in a way that tempts us to make such an identification.

Kant's later distinction between the will and the power of choice highlights the way in which the critical philosophy develops while remaining consistent with itself. Kantian philosophy properly speaking is all about metaphysics, that is, "rational knowledge by means of concepts alone." The 1797 Metaphysics of Morals is thus perfectly and appropriately titled. The will is, as Kant says in his second period, neither free nor unfree, and it is the power of choice and it alone which is rightfully called "free." (pp. 58, 61, 178) The will legislates which maxims put forth by the power of choice are valid, and that legislation is pure, a priori, and not colored by empirical fact. What can be validly legislated is a matter of "pure" reason, i.e., metaphysics, and not a feature of empirical human nature at all. Failure to observe this has led some commentators to see Kant as a precursor to contemporary legal positivism, a misreading that is once again tempting given some of Kant's writings. (In the terms of Anglophone scholarship, Kervégan is coming down on the side of Arthur Ripstein against that of Jeremy Waldron, although neither is mentioned.)

To hold this reading together, Kervégan takes Kant's early (1784) essay on "History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View" as the document that knits together this emphasis on Kant as a metaphysician of normativity and his later writings, which include what might seem like the perfect counterexample to this thesis: Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1798). What is striking about the 1784 piece is that anything like a philosophy of history should be off limits to any system that restricts itself to knowledge by means of concepts alone. Kervégan agrees: There can be no Kantian metaphysics of history. What, then, is Kant doing in those writings? Famously, Kant early in his development said that philosophy sought the answers to three questions, having to do with what we can know, what we ought to do, and for what could we rationally hope. In the later writings, he said that they all add up to answering the question 'what is man?'. Now, if the metaphysics of nature (the laws of "the understanding") answers the first question, and the metaphysics of morals (ethical and juridical) answers the second, it is religion within the limits of reason alone (pure concepts alone) that answers the third question. (Faith-based religion cannot answer the part about "rational" hope.)

What answers the fourth question? It looks like "Anthropology," but that itself cannot be a matter of "pure concepts" and thus is not philosophy properly speaking. Kant's answer has to do with his views on reflective teleological judgment as he lays them out in the third Critique. The universalizing subject of ethical and juridical normativity was already more concretely conceived in the 1784 essay as the "cosmopolitan" subject. In the Religion (1793) this "cosmopolitan" subject becomes the member of the "invisible church" who with other such subjects together form an "ethical commonwealth" (the ethisches gemeines Wesen which Kervégan renders as "cité éthique", p. 155). The faculty of reflective judgment renders the judgments about whether it is rational to hope for an anthropologically established cosmopolitan subject. It alone is capable of organizing the domain of history in this way (unlike the domains of the metaphysics of nature and of the moral, i.e., ethics and the juridical). The Kantian philosophy of history thus stands at the frontier of the descriptive and the normative, and it brings teleological judgment to bear on the issue. As Kant thought of history in these terms, however, he vacillated. Sometimes he thought of history as a kind of correlative to physiological anthropology -- a matter of empirical description and hypothesis, not of metaphysics. But, as in the 1784 essay, he also thought of it as a moral history, whose object, as it were, is the concept of the cosmopolitan citizen, the member of the "invisible church." This view subjects history to teleological judgment: although moral progress cannot be verified, there is still the free choice to view history in terms of moral progress (at least in terms of juridical normativity although not in terms of ethical normativity). This free choice has to be based on a "partiality to reason" (a phrase taken from Habermas) that founds the rational faith in (but not knowledge of) moral progress. (p. 171) The Kantian philosophy of history is thus not metaphysics but is a matter of rational faith, which, however, rests on something very much like a pure concept (the cosmopolitan subject).

This leads Kervégan to speculate that what we have in Kant is a kind of sketch of what Hegel called "ethical life" (Sittlichkeit). There is, of course, the difficulty that Hegel himself was fully explicit in rejecting the idea that he and Kant meant the same thing or shared the same concept. Hegel added that he thought that Kantian morality actually excludes the formation of the concept of "ethical life." Kervégan duly notes Hegel's objection but lightly brushes it aside. Drawing on Kant's usage of terms such as "common (or "communal") reason" used in the Grundlegung -- "gemeinen Menschenvernunft," usually rendered by Kant translators into English as "ordinary reason" -- he suggests that this is in effect what Habermas calls "public reason", something partly institutionalized and partly informal, expressed in ordinary values, customs, shared beliefs and finding its echo in public opinion. (p. 182) However, Habermas is therefore wrong to think that Kant's "reason" is only monological and not attentive enough to the "sociality of reason." (p. 184) Kervégan suggests that reorienting the critical philosophy around the basic concept of the "cosmopolitan subject" -- as he has argued Kant in fact did -- itself opens up a much richer way of understanding the resources left in Kantian philosophy to handle the emerging questions confronting contemporary practical philosophy. In this way, Kervégan's Kant begins to dovetail with the picture of Kant we have received especially from Anglophone Kant scholars like Barbara Herman, or Japa Pallikkathayil, among others, and it contrasts with the "teleological" Kant who has appeared in Christine Korsgaard's, Allen Wood's and Stephen Engstrom's work (among others). Kervégan's Kant remains much more resolutely metaphysical than some of those other interpretations.

One of the appeals of these ways of reading Kant is the way they promise to tamper down what at first looks like Kant's rigorism and his apriorism and to open up a broader range of reflection more in tune with the kind of rigor and flexibility one finds in, most notably, Rawls' approach. Kervégan's Kant is not Rawlsian, but rather Habermasian, although maintaining a much stronger commitment to Kantian metaphysics than what Habermas calls his "post-metaphysical" approach. Nonetheless, Kervégan's approach does have to lean very hard on Habermas's views of how universalization in ethics is supposed to work. Kervégan does not really show how the universalization test actually works in distinguishing proper from improper maxims -- perhaps he would have to incorporate something like Barbara Herman's conception of perceptions of salience -- but simply argues that the formalism charge is a red herring.

Kervégan's Kant has a metaphysics of normativity that certainly looks to be at least slightly at odds with the kind of Aristotelian-inspired re-readings of Kant that people such as Korsgaard, Nancy Sherman, Onora O'Neill, and Engstrom have recently elaborated. Of course, the original combination of Kant with Aristotle was that carried out by Hegel himself, and it says something about the current dynamic of Kant scholarship that it has, as it were, felt itself internally pushed into an Aristotelian direction and thus has also pushed itself towards something that on the surface bears some similarity to a Hegelian conception of concrete social life as informing the practices of reason. Is this only a surface similarity?

The categories of Sittlichkeit (ethical life) were for Hegel shapes of life itself. Life has an internal teleological structure in that explanations of the organism have to make use of concepts in which the parts are what they in they are in terms of the role they play in maintaining the organism and the consequences (and thus harms and benefits) they have for the whole organism. Things can go badly or worse for living things but not for the non-living, and better or worse depends on the nature of the species. (For Hegel, there can also be no teleological account of why there are some species rather than another, but that is another story.) For humans, this teleology is complicated since the nature of the species is to be self-conscious and therefore to be a problem to itself in a way that is not possible for other animals. Thus, once one goes beyond a certain general way in which things can go wrong for humans (organic disease, perhaps the satisfaction of certain social needs for friendship and some form of respect and so on), there are many other different ways things can go well or badly. One can fail at being a parent, succeed in one's profession as a doctor, perform only moderately as a citizen, succeed as an aristocrat, only muddle through as a Christian, or live a life in industrial society fully alienated from one's employment, and so on. The kinds of social meanings -- not social "roles," since that would be too theatrical -- are the historically and socially indexed ways in which the species articulates itself, and the requirements associated with those social meanings are the requirements, at least from the experiential point of view, of life itself for such self-conscious creatures. To put it even more abstractly, the logical form of judgments about such shapes encountered in Sittlichkeit is that of life itself, with the proviso that this particular shape of life, because it is self-conscious and is thus aware of itself, is social and historical in character.

It is not clear that even with his refreshing interpretation Kervégan is right to see Kant's philosophy as an esquisse of what Hegel will then develop into a doctrine of "ethical life." For that, Kant would need more than his rigorous transcendental logic and something that would allow for there to be some kind of logic to the development of Sittlichkeit itself that would be more than applying the pure norms found in ethical and juridical judgment to empirical states of affairs. When Hegel himself speaks of this in his appropriately named Science of Logic, he calls these logical shapes a realm of shadows (das Schattenreich), a phrase which suggests not only their slippery and abstract quality but which raises an even more fundamental question. If they are shadows, what is casting the shadow? The most obvious answer is: The social practices developing over historical time of the species that is self-conscious, a species for which Hegel reserves the term, Geist. For that, one will have to deal with a different structure of the normative than Kant's. Kantians who also want to be Aristotelians, and Aristotelians who also want to be Kantians may not cozy up to the idea that implicit in this desire is the push to become a Hegelian. For them, Kervégan's Kant might seem a more attractive option. Whether that option can stay open is another question.