La Signification et l'enseignement: Texte latin, traduction française et commentaire du De Magistro de saint Augustin

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Emmanuel Bermon, La Signification et l'enseignement: Texte latin, traduction française et commentaire du De Magistro de saint Augustin, J. Vrin, 2007, 610pp., €55.00 (pbk), ISBN 9782711619511.

Reviewed by Roland J. Teske, S.J., Marquette University


Bermon's huge volume on Augustine's De Magistro will be a boon to many scholars interested in the thought of Saint Augustine and his theory of language. Besides reproducing the best critical text for the work, namely, that from the Corpus Christianorum, Series Latina, by K. D. Daur, and providing a new French translation on facing pages, the volume offers its reader a detailed commentary on one of Augustine's most challenging early works.

Bermon also provides his readers with a wealth of information about the characters in the dialogue, especially Adeodatus, Augustine's young son by the woman with whom he lived for many years. The author sets the work in its historical context in the years immediately after Augustine's conversion and baptism at the hands of Ambrose of Milan in 387. He also sketches its influence in the Middle Ages when it was relatively neglected and in contemporary philosophical literature where it has been the subject of much greater interest, especially in the context of Wittgenstein's discussion of Augustine's theory of language.

The volume, which is a part of Bermon's habilitation, summarizes the aims and achievements of the early works of Augustine written at Cassiciacum and Rome before his return to Africa and situates the De magistro within Augustine's life and early works. After presenting some of the views of recent scholars on the dialogue, Bermon turns to the subsequent influence of De magistro, which was relatively minor compared to many of Augustine's other works even in the thirteenth century when the revival of Augustinian thought was quite influential. Although the author mentions a number of medieval theologians who showed some interest in the De magistro, he does not mention Henry of Ghent, who was the leading Augustinian in the late thirteenth century and whose theory of learning was deeply influenced by the thought of the bishop of Hippo. In the modern period Malebranche and his followers receive considerable attention, but it is contemporary language theory that is the principal background against which the work is studied.

The main thrust of the present commentary, as the author describes it, is twofold: "d'une part le rapport de la pensée augustinienne du langage avec la philosophie antique et d'autre part les critiques que lui ont été addressées par la philosophie contemporaine à partir de Wittgenstein" (p. 46). The two parts turn out not to be unrelated since, according to the author, if one understands the account of language in De magistro in the context of ancient philosophies of language, at least some of the Wittgensteinian criticisms of Augustine's claims about language tend to evaporate.

After singling out two main sources for Augustine's theory of language, namely, his reading of the Stoic dialecticians and his interest in grammar, both of which led to books that he wrote on dialectic and grammar, Bermon turns to the Augustinian image of language to which Wittgenstein devoted so much attention and criticism. According to this image augustinienne of language, words denominate objects and phrases are combinations of such denominations. One of the goals of Bermon's commentary on De magistro is to read that work along with selections from the other principal texts in which Augustine deals with language in the light of "l'image augustinienne," not simply to show that the image that Wittgenstein constructed is "simpliste," as A. Kenny claimed, but to use it as a model for freeing up the philosophical interest of Augustine's semantics.

The principal thesis of the De magistro is to show that nothing is taught by signs so that Christ is the sole teacher of knowledge, and, according to Bermon, that thesis is proven at the end of a critique of language on three fields of investigation: the signification of the parts of speech, the reflexivity of language, that is, the way in which language is able not only to speak about the world, but also to speak about itself, and the critique of the power of signs. The commentary itself begins with an introductory part on speaking and teaching, which corresponds to the first seven paragraphs of the dialogue. It first deals with the goals of various uses of language, such as teaching, singing, and praying. Secondly, it turns to the claim that every sign signifies some thing, where the author introduces elements of the ancient semantics and deals with the signification of such words as "if" (si), "nothing" (nihil), and "from" (de), all of which raise serious problems if one takes Augustine to have meant that every sign signifies some object in the way nouns like "tree" and "horse" signify objects in the world. Thirdly, the introductory section compares signifying and showing.

There follow the two principal parts of the commentary. The topic of the first, which corresponds to paragraphs 7-21 of the dialogue, is the signs of signs, while the topic of the second, which corresponds to paragraphs 22-46, is the signs of signifiables, that is, signs not of other signs, but of things signified by signs. In this latter part Bermon, following Augustine, discusses the ambiguity that results when it is not clear whether a word is used to signify something or is simply used as a word or utterance. Then he moves to the subordination of significance to knowledge, since knowledge is, after all, the goal of the signification of words. There follows a section that lessens the role of signs by emphasizing the thing signified rather than the sign and by showing that signs are not always necessary in order to teach something. In the following section, on paragraphs 33 to 46 in which Augustine argues that nothing is learned by signs, Bermon has an interesting discussion of the role of Platonic Ideas in learning. There follow sections on the learning of signs and the learning of language, where the author brings Augustine's thought into relation with various contemporary thinkers. The discussion of the power of words and of the Teacher seems somewhat foreign to the traditional way of understanding Augustine's Platonism and the role of divine illumination, but at least part of the difficulty lies in the task Bermon set for himself, namely, the analysis of Augustine's thought in the light of post-Wittgensteinian philosophy of language. For most contemporaries surely do not share Augustine's Platonic understanding of knowing as a kind of seeing of intelligible objects with the eyes of the mind. There follows a conclusion to the whole work in which the author summarizes the main points of Augustine's theory of language in relation to contemporary philosophy.

Different readers will, of course, find different parts of the work of greater or lesser interest. Personally I found the discussion of ancient theories of language and parts of speech more illuminating than the discussion of the Augustine's theory of language in the context of post-Wittgensteinian philosophy because the former clarified for me some of the oddities in what Augustine said about the signification of words and to a large extent nullified the Wittgensteinian criticism or caricature of Augustine's thought. The second part, on the other hand, will be of interest chiefly to those steeped in contemporary Anglo-American philosophies of language.

Bermon's commentary brings in many elements from other works of Augustine in which his theories of language and language learning are treated, such as his discussion of lying and the will to deceive, the ways in which one can misunderstand a text, the difference between believing and knowing, and images and mental words, but little is said about how the inner Teacher actually goes about teaching or what it is that one sees with the eyes of the mind. The author could and should, I believe, have devoted some significant consideration to what Augustine said about language in De Genesi contra Manichaeos, a work almost contemporary to De magistro, in which Augustine described life in paradise prior to the fall as a life in which words were not needed since the first parents could directly see each other's mind and since God directly communicated knowledge to the human mind without words. Thus lying was impossible before the fall, and speech became necessary only after and because of the fall. The theory of language in the De magistro should, I believe, be read in the context of our fallen existence after the sin because of which our first parents entered these mortal bodies in which thoughts could be concealed and could be communicated only through signs and then only with great difficulty, ambiguity, and frequent failure and with the need, furthermore, of illumination from the divine Teacher. To study the theory of language apart from the context of our fallen state overlooks the fact that the need for communication through signs with all the difficulties, ambiguities, and failures involved is part of the penal condition of fallen mankind.

Most contemporary Augustine scholars recognize that Augustine's thought developed in many areas over the years and that one should not presume without justification that it is legitimate to use later writings to interpret earlier ones. For instance, when Bermon uses the things Augustine said in the De trintate about the formation of a mental word, he needs to justify the use of a much later work to interpret an early dialogue.

All told, the long volume offers the reader a wealth of information on Augustine's theory of language in the De magistro and other works and does so in relation to ancient and contemporary theories of language. Like many works produced as part of the habilitation, the present volume contains much that most scholars already know and a good deal that many probably won't care to know. On the other hand, there are some brilliant insights that make the study a valuable contribution to our knowledge of one of Augustine's most challenging early dialogues.