Lacan: Anti-Philosophy 3

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Alain Badiou, Lacan: Anti-Philosophy 3, Kenneth Reinhard and Susan Spitzer (trs.), Columbia University Press, 2018, 261pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231171489.

Reviewed by Graham Harman, Southern California Institute of Architecture


This book contains the lightly edited transcript of Alain Badiou's 1994-95 seminar on the psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan, whom Badiou treats as the most recent -- and perhaps the last -- of a storied lineage of "anti-philosophers" shadowing Western philosophy since Heraclitus. The reason for the subtitle, Anti-Philosophy 3, is that the present treatment of Lacan follows a pair of year-long seminars on Nietzsche and Wittgenstein (both anti-philosophers in Badiou's view) while preceding another on St. Paul (also treated as an anti-philosopher). What Badiou means by anti-philosophy is the central question of this review.

This was the first of Badiou's seminars to appear in English, though a dozen or so had already been published in French. Kenneth Reinhard and Susan Spitzer have produced a glittering translation that faithfully captures Badiou's trademark style: by turns erudite, brash, and amusing. By the philosopher's own admission, the term "seminar" is a misnomer. These were actually public lecture courses; audience involvement was limited, though at times it could be fiery. Columbia University Press seems committed to publishing the entire seminar series in English under Reinhard's editorship, with the remarkable 1985-86 seminar on Malebranche already available as well (Badiou 2019).

Often enough, the unpublished works of important philosophers turn out to be a disappointing rehash of thoughts available elsewhere in more polished form. Among continental thinkers, the two great counter-examples have long been Heidegger and Lacan. We would obviously lose much of our understanding of Heidegger without the Marburg and Freiburg lecture courses, while the Lacan of the Seminar is generally more approachable than the gnomic cryptographer of the 1966 book Écrits (Lacan 2007). Based on the Badiou seminars I have read so far, all of them outstanding works filled with surprises, it seems possible that our understanding of his philosophy will soon be transformed to a significant degree.

Badiou, still alive and well in Paris at the age of 82, remains near his peak of influence. Although outside critics of continental philosophy tend to dismiss this subfield as a swamp of social constructionist relativism, incorrigibly hostile to logic, mathematics, and natural science, continental thought itself is in the midst of a rationalist phase. We can see this in Badiou's fondness for the insights of set theory (Badiou 2005), and his close ally Slavoj Žižek's frequent recourse to quantum physics (Žižek 2012), not to mention the deep suspicion of both towards Heideggerian historicism and Derridean word-play.

The idealism to which Badiou and Žižek are nonetheless committed -- despite their shared discomfort with the term -- stems not only from their respective theoretical debts to Descartes and Hegel. There is also their joint fascination with Lacanian psychoanalysis, in which the Real does not refer to an autonomous reality independent of the mind, but simply marks an impasse of formalization: a trauma that disturbs the symbolic order. Žižek makes the connection obvious by expressing allegiance to Lacan in nearly everything he writes. In Badiou's case, the exact relation with the French psychoanalyst has remained more elusive, if never hidden, and at times he has even downplayed his debt to Lacan (Badiou and Hallward 1998). But the present seminar makes abundantly clear that Badiou's self-differentiation from Lacan is central to his own self-conception as a philosopher.

Session 1 introduces anti-philosophy, an eighteenth-century term first revived by Lacan himself. When Nietzsche and Wittgenstein are joined with Lacan, we have a complete "phase" of anti-philosophy that the latter brings to a close; the previous phase consisted of Pascal, Rousseau, and Kierkegaard, though even they were by no means the first of their breed. Badiou tells us little about what constitutes a full phase, and sends mixed messages as to whether there will be more anti-philosophers in the future. But what unites all such figures is a certain "destitution of the category of truth" in favor of a specific "act" that differs for each anti-philosopher (Nietzsche's madness, Wittgenstein's mystical retreat, psychoanalysis for Lacan). The anti-philosophers also display an "anticipated certainty of victory" over the philosophers that may seem arrogant on the surface, but actually marks a humble surrender of any originality: as in Wittgenstein's claim in the Tractatus that it makes no difference to him if the ideas in the book have been thought by someone else previously. Furthermore, anti-philosophy "discredits" truth rather than refuting it, offering a therapeutic treatment for philosophy rather than a new philosophy in its own right. In Lacan's case, truth is discredited through the repeated clinical experience of a traumatic Real that resists exact formulation. Yet the Real is not beyond all elucidation: although it cannot be formulated exactly, it can still take the shape of a "matheme" that captures the exact limits of our access to truth. As readers of Lacan know, his Real has a more idealist twist than Kant's thing-in-itself, since it cannot be said to exist apart from its entanglement with the symbolic and imaginary orders. (Lacan 2016)

In Session 2, Badiou declares that Kant and Heidegger are the two philosophers who come closest to anti-philosophy, through their shared attention to the largely inaccessible realms of the thing-in-itself and Being, respectively. Yet they are not quite anti-philosophers, since they acknowledge and build upon their philosophical predecessors rather than simply dismissing them. Moreover, there is no distinctive "act" associated with either of these figures; the later Heidegger does offer the hope of a new kind of post-metaphysical thinking, but he neither requires nor performs any specific anti-philosophical act. Finally, anti-philosophy generally prefers the "meaning" of its act to any conception of "truth." Though Badiou's sense of "meaning" is sometimes cloudy, the term bothers him due both to its association with an ultimately religious sense of existence and his opposition to the hermeneutic model of endlessly explorable depth. Badiou also agrees with Lacan -- and against Heidegger -- that Parmenides and Heraclitus differ radically. Yet Badiou prefers the philosopher Parmenides, whereas Lacan endorses the purported anti-philosopher Heraclitus.

Session 3 states further that each anti-philosopher has one or more particular philosophers they like to use as whipping-boys: Descartes for Pascal, Voltaire/Hume for Rousseau, and -- most famously -- Hegel for Kierkegaard. Nonetheless, the anti-philosopher does not address a primarily philosophical audience. For Pascal, the addressee is the libertine rather than the Cartesian; for Rousseau, it is the "bad man"; for Kierkegaard, it is woman; for Lacan, the psychoanalyst. This brings us back to Badiou's claim that Lacan "brings contemporary anti-philosophy to a close," which would seem to leave the door open for other versions in the future, if not for the added remark that Lacan's is "the first immanent anti-philosophy, and, as such . . . the last anti-philosophy." What makes Lacan different from previous anti-philosophers is that he is the first who can be sure that his "act" has actually taken place: namely, the self-analysis carried out by Freud, to whom Lacan perpetually calls for a return. Ironically, Badiou will argue later in the seminar that these two great psychoanalysts have surprisingly little in common.

In Session 4, Badiou begins his treatment of Lacan's threefold anti-philosophical formula that philosophy (1) "is blocked" by mathematics, (2) "plugs the hole" of politics, and (3) has love "at the heart of its discourse." The focus of this session is on the first point. Whereas Nietzsche and Wittgenstein see mathematics as an empty logic or grammar, their fellow anti-philosopher Lacan (much like Badiou) treats it as the only possible science of the real. Insofar as mathematics is stripped of all meaning, it counts for Lacan as "the bone of truth." That is to say, since the real is not external or composed of various hidden layers of meaning, the opposition between thought and world loses importance in favor of the difference between the saying and the said. The very act of saying something in opposition to the content of what is said becomes the basic dualism. The reader is reminded here not only of Pascal's wager and Kierkegaard's existential decisions, but also of the difference between constative and performative statements in speech-act theory. To answer Lacan's claim that philosophy is "blocked" by mathematics, Badiou considers the important cases of Plato, Descartes, and Hegel, ultimately concluding that Lacan is wrong.

Session 5 shifts focus to politics and love, the other two sites of Lacanian accusation against philosophy. Badiou begins by opposing Heidegger's thesis on the unity of the history of philosophy. Philosophy is always divided, composed of mutually interfering cross-currents. One such case is the divide created by mathematics, which tempts some philosophers to restore (hermeneutic) meaning to it rather than accepting the truth of its very meaninglessness: which marks the polar opposition between mathematics and religion. As for Lacan's claim that philosophy "plugs the hole" of politics, Badiou treats this in terms of all three key Lacanian orders: the imaginary, the symbolic, and the real. By plugging the hole, philosophy ignores the impasse of any attempt to master political understanding. Lacan was aware of this, and thus his major political act was the dissolution of his own school due to the danger of its becoming a stable institution. More generally, Badiou claims that "tyrannical anarchism" is Lacan's ultimate political teaching. As for love, Badiou does not speak here of human erotic life, but of the strange fact that Lacan thinks we can have "love" of knowledge but no "desire" for it. Desire, he insists, is always a passion for ignorance.

Session 6 is in many ways the intellectual heart of the seminar, linking Lacan's various objections to philosophy to the most basic features of his psychoanalytic theory. Lacan acknowledged four different types of "discourse" -- those of the hysteric, the master, the university, and the analyst -- and emphasized the dynamic process through which each rotates into the next. By contrast, philosophers want to avoid this rotation by claiming possession of a metalanguage; Lacan and Wittgenstein are similar in rejecting this. Whereas Lacan denies the existence of an independent world, treating the Real as an impasse of formalization or an absence of the Thing of enjoyment, philosophy tries to posit an unreachable thing-in-itself in order to avoid direct confrontation with this obscene Thing. Since Badiou mentions both Kant and Husserl here (139-140), it is worth noting that the two German thinkers are actually opposites on this point: Husserl's "to the things themselves" means a return to intentional objects entirely penetrable to the intellect, certainly not to Kant's Ding an sich. Furthermore, philosophy is also found guilty of reifying thought and positing a thinking substance, as in Descartes. And finally, whereas Lacanian psychoanalysis differentiates sharply between truth, knowledge, and reality, philosophy tries to break up this triad into mutually compatible pairs. The ungraspable Real is not unknown, but rather is beyond the very distinction between known and unknown. All anti-philosophers believe in a certain experience that does not deceive, such as conversion for Pascal and decision for Kierkegaard. Lacan tells us that for him anxiety is what never deceives, though Badiou insists this is true only if the anxiety is "correctly symbolized."

From Session 7 forward, Badiou turns his attention to Lacanian psychoanalytic practice. After Lacan's death in 1981, his followers broke apart into theoretical and clinical wings, each accusing the other of missing the point. Badiou's position is that the two cannot be separated: the relation between act and matheme is at the heart of Lacan's work. Kierkegaard holds that if someone is brought to the point where they are forced to make a choice, they will inevitably choose correctly. Lacanian analysis is also supposed to bring someone face-to-face with the Real, as opposed to the endless interpretations of meaning in Freudian analysis. It might seem that whereas anxiety in Kierkegaard (which is closely related to sin) has a merely preparatory role compared with the act of decision, anxiety in Lacan is coextensive with the decision itself. Not so, Badiou reminds us: for even Lacanian anxiety cannot lead to the act unless the failures and sufferings of the analysand are properly situated in the symbolic order: referring to the matheme. He rewrites the famous Lacanian phrase "Don't give way on your desire!" as "Don't give way on that which frustrates your desire!": namely, do not rush the search for a matheme of the Real.

Session 8 gives us Badiou's general verdict on the relative strengths and weaknesses of Lacan's intellectual position. Anxiety for Lacan refers to an unsymbolizable excess of the Real, but this needs to be dispensed by the analyst in small doses so as not to overwhelm the analysand. This leads Badiou to reflect on the role of time in psychoanalysis. The analyst is both the master who correctly symbolizes the unconscious and the anxious master who is overwhelmed by the surplus Real that overflows from the analysis. Where Badiou finds Lacan lacking is that, unlike Freud, he tells us little about the practical procedures of how to carry out psychoanalyses. Badiou maintains this position in the face of howls of protest from his audience.

Session 9 closes the seminar on an intriguing supplemental note, as Badiou engages in conversation with special guest Jean-Claude Milner, who had just published his own book on Lacan (Milner 1995). Milner holds that Lacan's Écrits is more essential than his Seminar, and argues that Lacan's "scientific" revision of Freud was influenced by Alexandre Koyré's Galileo-centric interpretation of modern science, which -- he notes in passing -- also had a deep impact on Badiou himself (Koyré 1957).

Although Lacan declares himself for philosophy against the objections of the anti-philosophers, there seems to be a more personal aspect to his treatment of the latter. For while philosophers are linked in this seminar with "truth" and anti-philosophy with "the act," and though Badiou is an outspoken advocate for truth against postmodern relativism, he also seems unusually impressed by what he calls the anti-philosophical act. This is perhaps even clearer in his own systematic works, in which any truth -- however universal -- always requires the retroactive fidelity of a Subject that ratifies it. More generally, it is hard to read Badiou, atheist though he is, without hearing frequent echoes of such religious anti-philosophers as St. Paul, Pascal, and Kierkegaard. In other words, though he does not say so in the present seminar, Badiou seems to interpret himself as the one who brings together philosophy and anti-philosophy at last. If this is the case, then his ambivalence as to whether or not Lacan is the last anti-philosopher would be the flip side of his well-known view that the last universally recognized philosopher is Heidegger. Stated differently, it would amount to an ambivalence on Badiou's part concerning his own achievement: has he succeeded in stitching together the legacies of the last anti-philosopher (Lacan) and the last philosopher (Heidegger)?


Badiou, A. (2005). Being and Event, trans. O. Feltham, London: Continuum.

Badiou, A. (2019). Malebranche: Theological Figure, Being 2, trans. J. Smith with S. Spritzer, New York: Columbia University Press.

Badiou, A. and Hallward, P. (1998). "Politics and Philosophy: An Interview with Alain Badiou," Angelaki 3.3, pp. 113-133.

Koyré, A. (1957) From the Closed World to the Infinite Universe, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press.

Lacan, J. (2007). Écrits: The First Complete Edition in English, trans. B. Fink, New York: Norton.

Lacan, J. (2016). The Sinthome: The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book XXIII, trans. A.R. Price.

Cambridge, UK: Polity.

Milner, J.-C. (1995) L'Oeuvre claire: Lacan, la science, la philosophie, Paris: Le seuil.

Žižek, S. (2012). Less Than Nothing: Hegel and the Shadow of Dialectical Materialism, London: Verso.