Laisser être et rendre puissant

Tristan Garcia

Tristan Garcia, Laisser être et rendre puissant, Presses Universitaires de France, 2023, 568pp., €29.90 (pbk), ISBN 9782130798941.

Reviewed by Oliver Feltham, American University of Paris


Tristan Garcia is a well-known novelist and essayist in France, and he has made inroads into the realms of metaphysics, ontology, and aesthetics with a series of ambitious works. His latest book, Laisser être et rendre puissant presents itself as a work of both critical metaphysics and ethics. A literal translation of the title in English gives us ‘Let be and make powerful’ which sounds like the second album of a dark metal band from Shropshire, but that should not dissuade the reader. For all its novelty and efforts to catalogue and dismiss all rival ontological and ethical orientations, however, the book ends up giving liberalism a fresh coat of paint.

The book starts with an account of ubiquitous conflict between human beings, a little like the way social contract theory positions itself against the state of nature, but there is no equivalent to Hobbes’ anthropological grounding of the war of all against all. Garcia's account does distinguish between three types of conflict: domination, violence, and exploitation; but it focuses on domination and exclusion, and on dramas of non-recognition and misrecognition. Att times it reads like an abstract caricature of a cancel culture quarrel in a faculty tearoom—and the fact that there are no tearooms left for faculty is precisely the point—the context no longer exists. Hence Garcia’s account of ubiquitous conflict is more of a premise than a conceptual construction. The role of this premise is to set up the ontological project of the book. Garcia diagnoses an ontological foundation to this ubiquitous conflict: people quarrel over what exists and over who exists, and within these quarrels all they see and understand are their differences. Everything separates humans—beliefs, customs, norms, desires, values, ideals, taste, manners—all of which involve an ontological claim. This is Garcia’s launchpad: the missing object of this all-enveloping squabble is the precise nature of whatever it is that actually does lie in common between all humans and all other beings. Garcia baptizes this mysterious ground the ‘distinct commonality’. This immediately gives metaphysics its newfound vocation: its task is to find and identify the lowest common denominator, a minimal commonality between human beings; that is to say, its task is to find out what we do actually have in common and to do so without relying on any shopworn universals such as human rights, humanity, reason, civilization, democracy, history, or respect for others (12).

A contemporary metaphysics—and this is where Garcia’s historical sketch begins—will leave such universals behind for two reasons. The first is that, rightly or not, they have been mired in innumerable controversies and contestations which are precisely what make up the conflict that forms Garcia’s premise. The second reason is that we—a nebulous ‘we’—are no longer faced with an evident commonality or coherence at the level of what there is—rather, in this epoch, we are confronted with an amorphous and continually changing mass (11). A new metaphysics cannot simply assume or start with a universal like being, God, or the cogito; rather it must search for an alternative ‘distinct commonality’ that will sidestep or slip underneath all these contestations.

To find this treasure Garcia sets out on a curious voyage of discovery by seeking commonality at lower and lower levels of determinateness. He calls this project a ‘catabasis’, a kind of descent, a programmed fall into the nebulous nether worlds of ontology, exploring all the entities that philosophers have dismissed or disqualified as non-existent: simulacra, accidents, fictional beings, universals, contradictions, representations, etc. This exercise comes complete with inaccurate literary analogues—Virgil’s descent through the nine circles—and religious allusions—the philosophical voyager stops at various ‘stations’ along the way, one for each type of ontology: critical, nihilist, substantialist, nominalist, materialist and realist, to which are added the stages of scepticism, David Lewis’ possible worlds countered by David Armstrong, and an odd account of the status of contradictions.

The linearity, the order of types of ontology, the rough portraits of those ontologies, and the not-quite-dialectical transitions of this catabasis may all give the reader pause, but its genre—an epic journey of discovery—is highly entertaining, not in the least because it creates a common discursive space in which Barry Smith pops up in a fleeting cameo alongside Ray Brassier and Reza Negarestani. That its genre is the epic goes some way to explain but not excuse the book’s inordinate length; another factor is its overly pedagogical style in which the same idea is expressed in many different ways and contexts.

Notwithstanding this verbosity, the project maintains its momentum as a voyage of discovery, searching for a hidden treasure: the contemporary meaning of ‘distinct commonality’. Along the way the philosopher risks distraction or fascination by a series of ersatz substitutes for this treasure, since the catabasis consists of a catalogue of ever more indeterminate beings, of every kind of entity that has ever been disqualified or dismissed during the construction of an ontology for its flimsiness and incoherence. The goal of this journey, however, is not to reach some ground of pure flux or a primal soup prior to any individuation: the idea is rather to get off at Clapham junction (Redfern for the Australians), that is to say, at the penultimate stop, or the last threshold, just before all distinctness is lost in the ocean of being. Some readers, of course, would prefer to get off at Waterloo.

Garcia’s motto is the opposite of Ockham’s razor: do not needlessly reduce the number of thinkable entities, admit the greatest possible number of existents, however indeterminate and inconsistent they may be. His disclaimer is that he does not seek to make any claims as to what there is, but rather to survey the field of possible metaphysics so as to find the weakest and least constraining criteria of legitimate existence so as to identify that which is most common but also the least determinate without dissolving into complete indeterminacy.

At the end of the catabasis he arrives at solitary possible being, which is mildly disappointing: it echoes Ethan Hawke’s bad existentialist reading of Heidegger’s being-towards-death in Reality Bites. But more surprises are in store to cheer up the discouraged reader: the next section is named ‘Nemesis’ and it portrays a disaster—the immediate conceptual collapse of this much sought for distinct commonality. If one does admit all possibilities, then, strictly speaking, one of these possibilities is the impossibility of all possibilities (253). Garcia has willingly embraced the register of high abstraction, and as such the purely hypothetical or theoretical nature of this threat does not, for him, diminish its danger. At second glance, however, this threat bears a family resemblance to the hospitable liberal’s nightmare—you invite someone to participate in an open liberal democracy who is fanatically destructive of open liberal democracies. I remember Chantal Mouffe pulled up and perplexed by this objection by a heckler (Sebastien Job) back in the mid 1990s at the University of Sydney. Tragically in recent years this latter threat has proved all too real for educators in France and Garcia takes it—in its abstract form—very seriously, repeating and reformulating it in different manners for over thirty pages. In short, if the procedure of the catabasis entails allowing the being of all beings—however inconsistent, slight, accidental, illusory or false—then it also allows the “being of what destroys the very possibility of allowing to be” (254). Even at this point, with his experimental procedure in ruins, Garcia maintains the liberal tonality of his project, rejecting the authoritarian response which would be to simply refuse entry to that one destructive possibility, the impossibility of all possibilities (268, 289). He also refuses the liberal hypocrite’s response, which would be to open the field of possibilities whilst adding a restrictive clause that identifies something necessary, free from the vagaries of possibilities, such as a transcendental condition of possibility. Garcia furnishes a nice example of this kind of exception: Karl-Otto Apel’s principles of democratic discussion are removed from the field of what can be democratically questioned and discussed (287).

What is the answer to this nemesis? ‘Faced with an antinomy, make a distinction!’ the Jesuits hammered into their recalcitrant pupils. Garcia—well-hammered—makes a distinction between what is possible, and what makes possible. He reformulates this distinction stating that a powerful (puissant) being is one that makes or renders possible. On the other hand, a being that is possible simply possesses a possibility. This distinction allows Garcia to reformulate his entire project: via his thinking, he wants—to a maximum extent—to make possible; that is to say, he wants his liberal thinking to be ‘more powerful’ than any authoritarian thinking without falling into the trap of becoming authoritarian. If this sounds like a superhero face-off in a Marvel movie, it is probably due to the prevalence of liberalism in Hollywood scripts.

So what then is power for Garcia? A power is a possibility that affects another possibility: it makes the latter possible, augments it, or suppresses it. A power is thus relational. Garcia then multiplies the number of ‘powers’ in his ontology by claiming that any two or more possibilities, if they appear together, however distantly, form a compossibility and hence a ‘power’. Even a relationship of indifference between these possibilities is a relationship. These ‘powers’ are then concretized in that they become particular properties shared by some beings, such as extension, or identity, or universality, or intensity. Garcia then shows how the particularity of such powers always entails the reduction or compression of the field of possibilities. Garcia’s ‘powers’ are hence the equivalent of Hegel’s determinate negation: the second stage of the dialectic of the will in the Introduction to Elements of the Philosophy of Right; as soon as a decision is made to will something in particular, there are a whole host of possible objects of the will that fall by the wayside.

This necessary sacrifice gives Garcia an idea as to how to escape his nemesis. The choice open for his project is either that of maximizing the field of the possible, but accepting a reduction of power, or that of maximizing power but accepting a restriction of the field of possibilities (295). To sacrifice power for the sake of expanding possibilities is characteristic of ontology, and specifically characteristic of Garcia’s catabasis. The catabasis ends in solitude because it sacrifices all power, which is relational. Given that the catabasis ends in isolated, unrelated, property-less dispersed possible beings, Garcia then argues that this destructive possibility (of the impossibility of all possibilities) cannot even take place, because any such action presumes the existence of relationships between possibilities, and there are no such relationships at the end of the catabasis.

Garcia’s ontological journey to find the most minimally determined commonality between beings which remain distinct before falling into a soup of indeterminacy has thus found its endpoint: “any being whatsoever, whatever its determinations are, is this: possible, it is alone possible, it is radically separate from other beings” (299). What then remains to be done? The necessary sacrifice of power for possibilities can be reversed into a sacrifice of possibilities for the sake of power. The task is now one of ‘making powerful’, and for this task it is no longer ontology but metaphysics that serves, since metaphysics is the discourse which reconstructs “the concrete world out of abstract bricks” (305). But what metaphysics in particular? There are many metaphysics available to the contemporary philosopher: Garcia sorts the candidates into three large categories: metaphysics of results (substance, object-permanence), metaphysics of process, and metaphysics of relations. The section tasked with choosing one of these candidates is entitled ‘anabasis’, and the criterion for the choice is that this metaphysics must augment power without diminishing, or with the least reduction of, the field of the possible (309).

It is at this point that this epic ride loses speed, its colors fade, and we find ourselves back in not the faculty tearoom but rather in the fantasies of one of Garcia’s least edifying characters, Mehdi Faber, from his novel Faber. The result of the anabasis is the choice of the metaphysics of resistance, a metaphysics which is briefly sketched and described rather than constructed. What exactly does this metaphysics resist against? Apparently, all authority (without differentiation) since authority per se, as defined by Garcia, is what reduces the field of the possible, or in other words, multiplies ‘impotences’.

The rest of the book—at the price of long digressions on various reductionist approaches to the nature of time, life, politics and ethics, and how to avoid being reductionist in such matters—draws up a metaphysical portrait of an ideal type of subjectivity that resists all reductions of possibility whilst at the same time rendering or giving ‘power’; or to be more precise, giving those powers that in turn do not reduce the field of possibilities (429). There is one question to which the book does not provide a satisfactory answer, despite raising that question itself—how might one resistant subjectivity cooperate with another resistant subjectivity so as to create something lasting, like an association or an institution?

There are three general reasons why it proves difficult for Garcia to address such a question. The first is that the abstraction of his argument has a tendency, at times, to drift into idealism. The second is that the argument often runs the risk of conflating politics with morality, and an ill-defined morality at that, which wavers between a light Levinasian openness to the other and a liberal intersectional refusal of all authority, domination, and hierarchy in the name of equality amidst difference. The third reason is that the argument ends in a contemporary avatar of the fantasy of the band of brothers: “an image. . .of distinct beings that confront each other, respond to each other, and that never allow themselves to be reduced to each other”, whereby “one and the other are all the more powerful through mutually resisting each other and forming within that resistance” (365, 462). Garcia’s conclusion, in his search for a way of thinking that identifies the distinct commonality of all beings while simultaneously opening the field of possibilities to the maximum extent, is that “nothing is more powerful than resisting. . .than thinking everything that is as if it were distinct, equal, and in the process of formation” (393). A band of brothers is not a lasting collective: it’s an ideal moment.

In short, Tristan Garcia’s latest work of philosophy is a cumbersome and odd object to address for the casual book reviewer. It begins its project with a sketch of conflict yet it lacks any analysis of concrete instances of violence and exploitation. As part of its argument, it proposes an encyclopaedic overview of contemporary metaphysics, yet many readers will find it quite difficult to recognize their favourite metaphysicians in Garcia’s portraits. It offers a metaphysical grounding of a morality of ‘letting be and making powerful’ yet avoids any engagement with the difficulties and dilemmas of practical reason. Almost no philosophical object is missing from its anthological grasp, yet what is missing is a grounded account of the relationships between temporality, affect, particular institutions, particular collective bodies, and particular conflicts. At one point Garcia asks a great question: “what is the exact status of the empirical knowledge that allows ontology to begin” (21)? I would submit that ontological discourse begins—in practical situations, outside the faculty tearoom—when dysfunction occurs, and things do not go as planned.