Land and the Given Economy: The Hermeneutics and Phenomenology of Dwelling

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Todd S. Mei, Land and the Given Economy: The Hermeneutics and Phenomenology of Dwelling, Northwestern University Press, 2017, 251pp., $34.95 (pbk), IBSN 9780810134065.

Reviewed by by Casey Rentmeester, Bellin College


Todd S. Mei examines the problematic assumptions of modern economic conceptions of land through the lenses of hermeneutics and phenomenology. Displaying an equally impressive mastery of economics and philosophy, Mei argues that popular economic conceptions of land that think of it narrowly as a form of capital stemming from the work of thinkers like Locke and Marx fail to recognize how our individual and communal being is dependent upon the land. Employing economic concepts from David Ricardo and Henry George alongside philosophical concepts from Heidegger, Mei argues persuasively that land not only provides the ground and source upon which economic production is possible, but also the opportunities for humans to dwell and embark upon meaningful projects.

Mei points out that "we generally and readily accept land as a form of capital" (65), which is essentially equivalent to conceiving land as "natural material given merely for and therefore subject to, human use" (114). This is evidenced by the typically unquestioned assumption that land is something to be owned, which undergirds the existence of the housing market. Perhaps the most succinct characterization of land being considered as capital in economic theory comes from Marx, who argues that "a natural force . . . does not belong to the general conditions of the sphere of production."[1] For Marx, nature serves merely as a basis for production, as Mei rightly notes (56-57). Thus, land should be uniformly regarded as capital. Mei argues that this common characterization of land is problematic for two reasons. First, as Ricardo has noted, this doesn't take into consideration that "land is not . . . uniform in quality."[2] Landowners with more fertile land have a competitive advantage over landowners with less fertile land. Secondly, as George has asserted, proximity to commercial centers plays a factor in the value of the land as well.[3] If, for instance, a plot of land is closer to a concentrated area of market forces, the owner of this plot has a competitive advantage over those who own land in more remote areas. Thus, regarding land simply as capital is narrow-minded.

This leads Mei to his fundamental question: "what is the nature of our fundamental relation to land?" (3). As Heidegger would be quick to note, "What is 'natural' is not 'natural' at all . . . . The 'natural' is always historical."[4] Thus, we would expect humans living in different historical periods to have different conceptions of the land that they would have regarded as "natural." Mei notes that during medieval Europe, land was regarded as a gift of God (28). We should add that in many indigenous cultures, land as property or capital would be a totally foreign concept since it was regarded as sacred and even considered to be a relative in some Native American conceptions.[5] If humans have historically had vastly different understandings of land than merely as capital, then perhaps we can reinterpret our conception of land as well. Mei sets out to argue that "land provides for human existence not just materially but ontologically in the sense of constituting our existence and our understanding of what it means to exist" (91). Since "our individual being is dependent on land" (134), "being-landed seems to drive towards a concrete response in which we not only dwell, but do so in a way that gives back to the land" (153). Put concisely, all of our human projects not only presuppose being-landed, but the land provides us with the ground upon which we engage in any human activity whatsoever. Thus, Mei proposes that we enact a tax on ground rent, that is, on "the surplus arising from land and the human interaction with it" (185), as a way of giving back to the land. Following George, he claims that this tax should not be seen as a penalty, but rather of a way of recognizing that ground rent should be seen as belonging to the public since, after all, its value is not the result of the landowner's production.

Mei should be applauded for not only critically analyzing the narrow view of the land as capital and elucidating the land as an ontological ground but most importantly for providing a practical solution with his proposal of a ground rent tax. All too often, philosophers are quick to identify problems without providing any possible concrete solutions. By providing a practical solution, Mei philosophizes in the "real world of sweat and dirt,"[6] as William James would put it. One might, however, question Mei's claim that we should appropriately display gratitude to the land (153). While he doesn't offer explicit examples as to what a "gratitudinal" relationship with the land may look like above and beyond the ground rent taxation proposal, one can gather that it would be one in which we are thankful for the land since we simply would not be without it. However, is it possible to give thanks and display gratitude for something that simply could not be otherwise? Doesn't gratitude imply that a situation could be different, and that one is thankful that things are better than they would be in the alternate situation? For instance, I live near Lake Michigan, and I can be thankful for all that the lake provides materially and ontologically. Materially, it provides drinking water for the city in which I reside, is used as a mode of transport for ships that carry goods into the city, and provides a food source with its array of species of fish. Ontologically, the lake allows me to be a fisherman, to be a kayaker, and to be a person who can relax on the beach and watch the waves on a summer day. I am thankful for the lake because I could very well live in a desert where such material provisions could not be so easily procured or ontological possibilities so easily enacted. One could argue that it doesn't make sense to talk about being thankful for being-landed in the same way since, according to Mei's own account, being-landed is a given for all humans.

If this account is right, there is reason to believe that a more appropriate philosophical avenue for respect for nature in a Heideggerian context can be found in the concept of place. Jeff Malpas, for instance, states, "it is our own embeddedness of place in us that underpins and should guide environmental care and concern."[7] Mei deals with the philosophies of place that are found in the work of Edward S. Casey and Malpas in Chapter 4. In differentiating himself from such views, he states explicitly that "land is not reducible to place; it allows place to manifest" (112). While I think Mei is right about this, one could argue that one cannot situate gratitude to land as such but rather to place. In this regard a Heideggerian environmental ethics would be in line with the ecofeminism of Val Plumwood, who argues that a proper environmental ethics involves "particularity, through connection to and friendship for particular places, forests, animals, to which one is particularly strongly related or attached."[8] I have argued that Heidegger himself displayed such an attachment to his environmental surroundings near his hut in Todtnauberg.[9]

This criticism doesn't necessarily have any ultimate bearing on the soundness of Mei's basic argument, which includes the claim that the narrow view of the land as capital is misguided. One key result of this conception of land as capital is that land "can be owned exclusively and in perpetuity" (8). Mei's hermeneutical analysis of land in this economic sense, as well as his alternative understanding of land as that which provides for our material and ontological existence leads to the convincing conclusion that "land can be privately possessed but not owned, if ownership involves exclusive rights to title, use, and profit in perpetuity" (187). In this regard, Mei gives us good reason to reflect on the generally unquestioned understanding of the land as something to be owned. With his understanding of land as communal, he also provides a way to overcome what Charles Taylor calls "fragmentation," which occurs "when people come to see themselves more and more atomistically, otherwise put, as less and less bound to their fellow citizens in common . . . allegiances."[10] Therefore, we can say that Mei's ontological analysis of the land does more than just question the nature of our fundamental relation to land: it also questions the fundamental relation humans have to each other.

[1] Karl Marx, Capital: Volume III (Penguin, 1993), 784-785.

[2] David Ricardo, The Works and Correspondence of David Ricardo, Volume I, ed. Piero Sraffa (Liberty Fund, 2004), 70.

[3] Cf. Henry George, Progress and Poverty (Robert Schalkenbach Foundation, 1935), 170.

[4] Martin Heidegger, What is a Thing?, trans. W. B. Barton, Jr. and Vera Deutsch (Henry Regnery Company, 1967), 39.

[5] Cf. Laurie Anne Whitt et al., "Indigenous Perspectives," A Companion to Environmental Philosophy, ed. Dale Jamieson (Blackwell, 2003), 3-20.

[6] William James, "What Pragmatism Means," in Pragmatism and Four Essays from The Meaning of Truth, ed. Ralph Barton Perry (Meridian Books, 1955), 57.

[7] Jeff Malpas, "Human Being as Placed Being," Environmental & Architectural Phenomenology 25, no. 3 (2014): 9.

[8] Val Plumwood, "Nature, Self, and Gender: Feminism, Environmental Philosophy, and the Critique of Rationalism," Hypatia 6, no. 1 (1991), 21.

[9] Cf. Casey Rentmeester, Heidegger and the Environment (Rowman and Littlefield International, 2016), 78-79

[10] Charles Taylor, The Ethics of Authenticity (Harvard University Press, 1991), 112-113.