Language: A Biological Model

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Millikan, Ruth Garrett, Language: A Biological Model, Oxford, 2005, 228pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199284776.

Reviewed by Brian Epstein, Virginia Tech


Ruth Millikan's new collection of essays continues the project initiated with her remarkable 1984 book, Language, Thought, and Other Biological Categories. That book was essentially three projects in one: a naturalistic account of the notion of a function; a theory, based on her treatment of functions, of the nature of linguistic items and semantic representation; and an application of the theory to a wide array of topics in language, epistemology, and metaphysics. In a number of areas, the book has been tremendously influential. Her work on functions has shaped a generation in philosophy of biology, particularly with respect to teleological explanation, and her approach to semantic representation has likewise played a major role in recent theories of mental content.

In the practice of philosophy of language itself, curiously, her work as yet has had less impact. There are a number of possible reasons for this. To her supporters, her vision of language and thought is radical and heterodox, to the extent that philosophers of language haven't been able to adopt her ideas without abandoning too much that is dear to them. To skeptics, her naturalistic theories either don't have the resources to treat meaning, cognitive significance, compositionality, and other central features of language, or else are too complex to weigh against more traditional accounts. In either case, there's been a longstanding need for a work that clarifies her views on meaning and other linguistic properties, and that connects her overall project more directly to issues in the philosophy of language.

Millikan's new book, Language: A Biological Model, aims to rectify this. The book is a collection of ten essays from the last decade, two of which are new and two substantially revised, addressing a cluster of topics of interest to philosophers of language. The essays are carefully organized to present Millikan's account of language in a novel, systematic manner. Overall, the essays can be divided into roughly three groups: the first three essays present an account of the nature of linguistic activity; the middle ones situate her theory of language in a larger philosophical context and examine the relation between language and thought; and the third group treats some widely-discussed topics in the philosophy of language: speech acts and illocutionary force, indicative versus imperative expressions, and the semantics/pragmatics divide.

This collection is a welcome new presentation of Millikan's work. It does have a number of flaws: it is often more complex than necessary, at times is too abstract and at times presents too many examples for the reader to process, and it can be somewhat repetitive. But all that deserves to be forgiven: it's unapologetically ambitious, uncommonly thought-provoking, and is full of insights, in every chapter. Moreover, she does often succeed at making her ideas more accessible than in other of her works. It's true that even in the essays that directly address well-known issues in the philosophy of language, it can be a challenge to connect her work with more traditional treatments. But it more than repays the effort.

In much of her earlier work, Millikan develops a set of naturalistic building blocks, centered on the notion of a "direct proper function," and then uses them to characterize linguistic items. Here she takes a different tack. She starts off by giving an account of convention, a notion that is more recognizably connected to language than are proper functions. For Millikan, though, convention begins in a more rudimentary form than the coordination-based conventions treated by David Lewis.

Over the course of five essays, Millikan delineates the characteristics of linguistic activity starting from this point. What Millikan calls "natural convention" involves reproduced and standardized patterns of activity, that are proliferated in large part on the basis of the weight of precedent. Only reproduction and precedent make an activity a natural convention: it doesn't require that the participants have any particular beliefs about their activity, or even that most people act in accordance with it. It's also not required that natural conventions have any function, biological or otherwise.

Where other accounts of convention take coordination to be its central feature, Millikan points out that "coordinating conventions" ought to be understood as a subset of conventions in general. Coordinating conventions she defines as natural conventions whose proliferation is a causal result of their achieving coordination among members of groups. The key idea is not that these just involve the coordination of the activities of different people. Rather, it's that coordination is the basis on which the activity is reproduced. Where a natural convention is reproduced largely on the weight of precedent, a coordinating convention is reproduced for the further reason that it solves coordination problems. To return to Millikan's other terminology, solving coordination problems is its "direct proper function." There can therefore be conventions that involve coordinated activity, but which don't have coordination as their proper function.

The next step in Millikan's treatment is to identify the characteristics that make certain coordinating conventions distinctively linguistic. The central feature is that they have the function of "semantic mapping." Millikan describes this in a number of these essays with the example of the honeybee dance used to communicate the location of a nectar source to bees back at the hive. The honeybee dance, Millikan notes, has a number of direct proper functions, but it's neither the functions on their own, nor their conventionality, that make the dance represent the location of the nectar. Rather, it counts as representational in virtue of the way it performs its function: namely, by possessing a correspondence rule or a mapping ("roughly…mathematical isomorphism") between the dance and the location of the nectar. And so Millikan arrives at linguistic expressions. Indicative expressions, for instance, involve stable conventions that have the function of solving coordination problems. They perform their function by being mapped to the way the world is.

In some ways, using convention as an entry point is not tremendously different from the approach she takes in her other works. As soon as we arrive at "coordinating conventions," the idea of a direct proper function has entered the picture; so the convention path into her theory converges with her other accounts. Nonetheless, starting with convention does to some extent make it more intuitive how she views the nature of linguistic activity. On the other hand, the use Millikan makes of convention also creates a nest of new phenomena to naturalize and intuitive notions to give an account of. One of the pleasures of reading her work is that it covers such a vast territory, and the treatment of convention is no exception. But at the same time, covering as much ground as she does also means that each topic is dealt with quickly, and it's difficult to be confident than any one of them will stand up to close scrutiny.

I'll illustrate with just one example: the first definition of natural convention. The characterization at first reading is quite plausible, but her account has a number of potential problems and unresolved complications.

Millikan points out that for an activity to be conventional requires that its reproduction be based in part on the weight of precedent. This involves more than just that it have been learned: an activity isn't a matter of convention if it's the only procedure for getting something done. And even if there exist many ways of doing something, such as lighting a fire, it's not a matter of convention that someone does it one way -- by rubbing two sticks together, for instance -- if that person doesn't know of any other way to do it. Convention involves a kind of arbitrariness in our choice of a course of action. As Millikan puts it, "a pattern is considered conventional only if thought to have little tendency to emerge or reemerge in the absence of precedent." This formulation and the accompanying discussion is reasonable as far as it goes, but isn't adequate for characterizing conventionality, for at least four reasons:

1. Any reproduced activity, of course, involves precedent. Speaking strictly, no reproductive pattern occurs in the absence of precedent.

2. The degree of "tendency" to emerge can't be the mark of conventionality: it may be far more common, in the absence of precedent, for the pattern of driving on the right-hand side of the road to emerge than for early societies to discover that fires can be made by rubbing sticks together. Still, driving on the right is conventional while rubbing sticks together, for such a society, is not.

3. A substantial complication is the condition that conventions are thought to have little tendency to emerge without precedent. The reason that rubbing sticks together to light a fire may not count as a convention is that someone doesn't know or realize that there are alternative, equally good or better, ways of doing it. As Millikan points out, for an activity to be conventional requires that it be thought or known that there are alternatives. Here, however, intuitions about convention get far more complicated than her discussion captures. Millikan repeatedly points out that for an activity to count as conventional doesn't require any beliefs on the part of the actor. This is plausible: I don't need to know that there are other ways of eating, besides using a knife and fork, for it to be a matter of convention that I use those utensils rather than chopsticks. On the other hand, there's good reason to insist that the conventionality does depend on the knowledge of the agent, as the example of rubbing sticks together shows. As Millikan notes, the idea of conventionality involves the "availability of genuine alternatives" -- but this itself isn't a straightforward notion to cash out.

4. Even if it's acknowledged that an action is being performed "on the weight of precedent," whether it's intuitively conventional can depend on how that precedent is being relied on. Suppose someone chooses to wash his hands with water and the floors with ammonia. It may be that that's because he knows that ammonia is too harsh for his skin, but is a better cleaner for the floor. In such a case his action isn't conventional at all. Or instead, it may be that he simply does it because he knows other people do it that way. If his only reason is this knowledge of precedent, then as Millikan points out, it counts as conventional. But suppose his use of precedent is somewhat different: suppose, as is often the case, that the actor believes (correctly) that other people use ammonia and water the way they do for a good reason, namely, that they've experimented extensively, and have determined that it's in fact the best way of doing things. So he's acting in a sense based on social precedent, but only inasmuch as the precedent is taken as evidence for the optimality of the action. This seems more like the non-conventional case, even though it's based on the weight of precedent. It also doesn't need to be conscious on the actor's part.

In short, Millikan's treatment of "natural convention" is on to something, but it's far too quick to be conclusive. Millikan's account becomes even more far-reaching when she moves to the discussion of meaning, on the basis of her treatment of functions. The mere possibility that the direct proper function of an expression can shed light on aspects of meaning is already surprising. And she makes a convincing case that if any naturalistic and pragmatic grounding of meaning is to succeed, it will probably look a lot like her account. Still, there's simply not enough said to make it plausible to the skeptic that, for instance, what she calls the "stabilizing function" of an expression, even if expressions do have stabilizing functions, ought be identified as a kind of linguistic meaning. Nor that the "semantic mapping function" of expression ought to be identified with another kind of meaning.

The middle essays in the book mostly move away from a presentation of Millikan's analysis of the building-blocks of language. In some of these, Millikan does give useful details on her construction that don't appear elsewhere. It may be useful to note that a good account of semantic mapping -- an important part of the picture -- is in the fifth essay. This essay aims to give a "bird's eye" account of her picture of the relation between thought and language. It doesn't actually fully accomplish that goal, since it concentrates largely on language and doesn't give equal time to her picture of thought, but it does provide one of the clearest presentations of a number of important issues that the other essays treat rather briefly. Overall, though, the middle section of the book focuses on situating her views on language in a broader philosophical context. Essay 4 is an interesting comparison of her approach to language with that of Robert Brandom, who along with Millikan was a student of Wilfrid Sellars. Millikan discusses a range of similarities and disagreements in what she and Brandom take from Sellars. The essay is particularly helpful in clarifying the motivations for her claim that intentional representations depend on having satisfaction-conditions, and that for a representation to have satisfaction-conditions depends on its uses. In other words, it nicely situates her project in a long tradition of use-centered accounts of language. More than other essays in the collection, I should note, this one presumes familiarity not only with Millikan's work but with a good deal of Sellars, Brandom, and to some extent Wittgenstein.

Essay 6 is a brief account of her view of kinds. This essay is presumably included in this collection because it's a topic of interest to philosophers of language, but properly speaking, it is closer to metaphysics than language, and overlaps substantially with her 2000 book, On Clear and Confused Ideas. Essay 7 then discusses the place of the philosophy of language in the discipline as a whole.

The last essays in the book helpfully turn to applying Millikan's theory of linguistic activity to performatives and other speech-acts. Performatives are a natural place to apply her theory, since in her treatment of language, their illocutionary and perlocutionary force is part of what it is for activities to be linguistic at all. In this group is an essay on the semantics/pragmatics divide, and also an interesting essay on what Millikan calls "pushmi-pullyu" representations. Here she argues that it's a mistake to think of the most primitive representations as being either descriptive ones like beliefs, or directive representations, like desires. Rather, there are representations that may be more primitive than either, which include both description and direction in a single representation. The purpose of these representations is to impart an intention in the hearer directly, and there are, she argues, linguistic forms that correspond to them. Many performatives, Millikan hypothesizes -- in particular, many of the performatives that involve formal conventions, like declaring a meeting adjourned or pronouncing a couple married -- correspond to these sorts of representations.

A different sort of performative is the focus of the other essay in this group, "Proper Function and Convention in Speech Acts." This is a discussion of a 1964 article by Strawson, and is perhaps the most direct treatment in this collection of a traditional problem in the philosophy of language. In his article, Strawson criticizes Austin's claim that every illocutionary act is done as conforming to a convention. He makes a distinction between two kinds of illocutionary acts, which Millikan labels "K-I" and "K-II" acts. K-II acts further some procedure with a conventionally prescribed form of words, while K-I acts don't conform to a conventional form. To perform a marriage, for instance, is a K-II act, whereas giving a warning can be done in any of a number of nonconventional ways, and thus is a K-I act. Millikan agrees with Strawson that there is a difference between these two kinds of performatives, and that Austin more or less correctly understands the K-II performatives. On K-I perfomatives, however, she disagrees with Strawson.

Strawson already notes in his article that a performative like a warning can include a conventional form that explicitly gives the illocutionary force of the act, such as "I warn you that…" Millikan, however, argues that this points to a disunity among K-I acts, since clearly not all K-I acts can be understood as belonging to that category in virtue of being free of convention. Moreover, there's a gray area, she argues, of other acts that don't neatly fall into the categories in Strawson's classification. There are, for instance, cases in which the explicit linguistic form does not match the illocutionary force of the act, as when "the armed robber smiles and says, 'I entreat you to hand over your money.'" (p. 160). Here the illocutionary force is a demand, even though the conventional form accompanying it is the form of a polite request.

Millikan thus proposes a different basis than does Strawson for distinguishing illocutionary acts from one another. She points out that there are different purposes to which performatives can be put, and proposes that K-I acts be defined by their cooperative proper functions. If, then, they're to be classified, that will be according to the mix of the purposes which the acts serve.

The most striking thing about Millikan's proposal is that it runs against the grain of the most basic distinction that Austin makes with respect to speech acts, between the illocutionary and perlocutionary aspects of acts. Austin's proposal and Strawson's response are aimed at classifying the illocutionary aspect of acts; what perlocutionary aspect a speech-act has, on both Austin's and Strawson's views, is largely independent of convention. For them, we may perform illocutionary acts so as to produce effects, but the kind of illocutionary act performed, and its conventionality in particular, is independent of the perlocutionary aspect. Millikan, on the other hand, seems to regard the two as closely intertwined. The causal effect of a particular speech act does not determine the character of that specific act's illocutionary aspect, but causal effects are a significant part of what determine the act's proper function. Which in turn, on Millikan's account, determines what kind of illocutionary aspect the act has.

So this short essay by Millikan might look like a paper suggesting a minor amendment to Strawson's view. But actually, it involves a radical reconception of the nature of speech acts altogether. This is exactly what makes Millikan's work difficult to assess, frustrating to apply, and yet indispensable reading. This essay, as with essentially every other one in the collection, is very complex, and needs a fair amount of unpacking to make sense of it. The reader coming fresh to Millikan's work ought to be cautioned that it's often tough going. Even in the early essays, some of the most basic points will only make sense to a reader who either is already familiar with the details of her earlier work, or else reads the collection attentively two or three times. Not until the third essay, for instance, are the basic building blocks of language in place; but even so, Millikan already makes a number of points about linguistic matters in the first two essays, such as on the role of convention in speech-act theory in the first and the functions of the grammatical moods in the second. These are points that can only make sense to someone who's already familiar with what comes later. Regardless, like her earlier work, this new collection is often fascinating and consistently thought-provoking, and many of her claims that seem on first look to be obviously wrong become, over time, utterly compelling. The book is a challenge, but it's worth it.