Language After Heidegger

Placeholder book cover

Krzysztof Ziarek, Language After Heidegger, Indiana University Press, 2013, 243pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253011015.

Reviewed by Thomas Sheehan, Stanford University


The first problem in addressing the topic of Heidegger and language is Heidegger’s own language, especially from 1936 on, when his technical terms and rhetoric become especially idiosyncratic.

First of all, Heidegger maddeningly gives common terms uncommon meanings, and does so without notice — for example, “Ereignis” does not mean “event” as it does in ordinary German, and “Dasein” doesn’t mean existence. Second, Heidegger was scandalously inconsistent in the ever-changing meanings he gave to his key term “Sein” and to its older spelling, “Seyn.” And third, the more opaque his language becomes (“the world worlds,” “the nothing nothings”), the less he seems to offer evidence, much less justification, for his apparently far-fetched claims.

This is not to say the later Heidegger does not make sense. The challenge, rather, is to ferret out the sense he does make from the eccentric language and rhetoric he employs. One approach (the one that I prefer) is to hose down Heidegger’s language to get at what he was trying to articulate, and then to express that in what Milton called “an answerable style.” An alternative approach is the circular one of remaining within Heidegger’s language while attempting to explain it. This approach, which medieval logicians called modus psittacinus (Aristotle, τρόπος ψιττάκινος, Hist. anim. VIII 12, 597b27-29), is widely favored in contemporary Heidegger scholarship and is exemplified by the work of such European Heideggerians as F.-W. von Herrmann and François Fédier, and in the Anglophone scholarship of Richard Capobianco, Parvis Emad, and contributors to the journal Heidegger Studies.

Krzysztof Ziarek is professor of comparative literature at SUNY Buffalo, where he teaches avant-garde poetry, philosophy and literature, and literary theory. He is well known in continental circles for his earlier book on Heidegger, Inflected Language: Towards a Hermeneutic of Nearness (1994). Those who appreciated that volume will find Language After Heidegger a condign continuation of its rhetoric and methodology, both of which are firmly embedded in the second approach above. Those who prefer the hosing-down approach can certainly learn something from this book but may find it rather tough going.

The goal of Ziarek’s four chapters is, first, to explain Heidegger on language, using the recently published volumes 70, 71, 74, and 85 of his Gesamtausgabe (Collected Edition), notebooks that date from roughly 1938 to 1942; and secondly, to discuss how language might function after metaphysics and even after Heidegger, both in poetry (for example that of Susan Howe and Myung Mi Kim) and in a somewhat generalized ethics based on the “majesty” and “powerless power” of being. In this review I focus on the first topic because it is central to everything else the book has to say.

Ziarek argues that language is not one topic among many but the topic of Heidegger’s later work, something he claims no one heretofore has spelled out. The bêtes noires of this volume are Saussurean linguistics and its role in post-structuralism, the linguistic turn (“the anthropologization of language”), and analytic philosophies of language, precisely because they miss the fundamental fact — and this is the major thesis of Ziarek’s book — that spoken language “unfolds from Ereignis,” which is “the inceptual Word, as the breaking open of language” (5).

To understand what that crucial statement means, we would do well to first step back into what the scholarship has already established about the whole of Heidegger’s project. That will allow us to understand his work on language and then to express that understanding in a less idiosyncratic prose. I divide what follows into: Heidegger’s position on language both early and late; Ziarek’s articulation of Heidegger’s position in the period 1938-1942; and the uniqueness, and difficulty, of Ziarek’s approach.

Heidegger’s argument

The most basic fact of Heidegger’s entire project is that it is phenomenological and thus has to do with meaning and ultimately with language. For him the reality of anything (its Sein or being) is not that thing’s existence “out there” in the world but its significance to someone within the context of that person’s current interests and concerns. Heidegger reinterpreted the being of things as their meaningful presence (Anwesen) to human beings. Phenomenologically speaking, the real (das Seiende) is the meaningful (das Bedeutsame), a position Heidegger garnered from Metaphysics II 1, 993b30-31, which is the source of the medieval axiom ens et verum convertuntur. Heidegger’s final goal, however, was not the meaningful presence of things but the source of such meaningfulness (die Herkunft vom Anwesen), i.e., whatever it is that makes meaningful presence (“being”) possible and necessary in human comportment. Heidegger’s argument can be reconstructed as follows.

To see and say “This is that” or “This tool is suitable for that task” is to express what one thinks (correctly or incorrectly) the current “being” of that thing is: how and as-what the thing is meaningfully present in the current situation. However, taking something as something (Aristotle’s τὶ κατὰ τινὸς λέγειν) entails discursively “traversing the open space” between the thing and its possible meanings. That open space — the “clearing” that enables and requires us to understand and say “is” — is the core of Heidegger’s thought. The open clearing lets us “take-something-as” and thus understand (correctly or incorrectly) the current “being”/meaningful presence of the thing.

In Heidegger’s idiosyncratic jargon: the clearing that makes discursive meaning possible is always already “thrown open” (= it is an a priori “given,” without a discernible reason why), and that thrown-openness is the very essence of human being. Heidegger calls this state of affairs “appropriation” (Ereignis): the ontological fact that we are a priori, and not by our own will, “brought-ad-proprium” (ap-propri-ated) to our ontological status as the clearing, the open space that makes discursive meaning possible and necessary.

Heidegger also expresses this by his signature phrase “Es gibt Sein.” Our “appropriation” to being the clearing (= Es) ultimately makes possible (gibt), and thus is the source of, all forms of meaningful presence (Sein). That is, our thrown-openness/appropriation is the basis of all discursiveness (taking-something-as) and thus the source of all language.

Not unambiguously, Heidegger calls Ereignis “Language.” I capitalize it (and wish Ziarek had done the same) to show that appropriation is not spoken language itself, or any rule-governed system of communication, but rather the ultimate source of all such language and communication. This is the meaning of Ziarek’s claim that man’s thrown-openness or appropriation is “the inceptual Word,” “the breaking open of language.” Here I capitalize “Word” for the same reason that I capitalized “Language”: to distinguish it, as what makes possible words and language, from the words and language it makes possible.

Ziarek’s articulation of Heidegger’s later position

Ziarek formulates Heidegger’s later position on language (which, in fact, is consonant with his earlier position) in the idiosyncratic language that Heidegger himself used in his now-published notes from 1938 to 1942. In the mid-to-late 1930s Heidegger began to wax metaphorical — and somewhat obscure -  in expressing what his project was about. (Some scholars incorrectly refer to this reformulation of Heidegger's abiding project in the 1930s as a "turn" or Kehre in his thought.) He started saying that Ereignis-qua-Language “speaks” (Die Sprache spricht), that it brings forth (ποίει) language, “unfolds” (ausgeht) into language, and even “words [itself]” (wortet) into language. Whether such tropes prove helpful or not, they are multiplied and magnified in Ziarek’s presentation.

Taking Ereignis as Language (I capitalize it as above), one might choose to say with Ziarek that “Language languages”; or that “Language transpires as words,” or that Language gives its own Word to words. One could also say that Ereignis, as the thrown-openness of the clearing-for-meaning, is an event of “Wording” (again, worten) or that appropriation “lets itself be said into words.” Alternately one might say that appropriation is “inflected” into words, or is a “poietic [sic] movement” into language. The clearing as thrown-open or appropriated could even be called a Vor-Wort (a Word prior to any spoken words), a “word-less, sign-free Utterance” that is somehow “beyond the domain of living beings,” even those living beings who have language (λόγον ἔχοντες). Further, one might go on to say that insofar as it operates in “a non-human register of Language,” the Word “unfolds as a leap that endows with Being.” (The object of “endows” is unclear: it might be either “words” or “things.”)

Such rhetoric can tend to become somewhat opaque, as in the following quite typical (and syntactically challenged) example. In explaining how Language becomes words, Ziarek, after a discussion of the word Riss in Heidegger, writes:

This is how “the event [= Ereignis] comes to word”: as a rift rising open into a design, with its traction into a pattern of furrows related by being held, drawn together as distinctly drawn up, the event literally gives words, or more precisely, it brings words by funneling them into signs. The outline of this rifting movement of language is critical to understanding the distinction between words and signs, which is elaborated on in chapter 2. (56)

(The explanation might have profited from knowing that Riss in Heidegger does not mean “rift” but rather is his translation of πέρας, “limit,” in the sense of where something ontologically “begins.”)

In another such example Ziarek first cites a text of Heidegger’s in both German and English. (The English capitalizations are mine):

Die Be-wëgung bringt die Sprache (das Sprachwesen) als die Sprache (die Sage) zur Sprache (zum verlautenden Wort). (GA 12: 250)

Such way-making brings Language (the essence of language) as Language (the Saying) to language (the resounding word). (BW, 418)

Ziarek then clarifies Heidegger’s neologism Be-wëgung (created from the Alemannic-Swabian dialect verb wëgen, “to clear a way”):

The idiomatically scripted and hyphenated Be-wëgung . . . is indeed a strange way-making, as it appears simply to revolve within lLanguage rather than to move anywhere or to produce anything. [Heidegger’s sentence] repeats the word  language [Sprache] three times, suggesting that Language keeps shifting its shape, so to speak, where as language’s essence (Sprachwesen) it [= Language] brings “itself” (as essential unfolding) as its own Saying into the articulated word. This threefold “movement has its essence in the event’s taking place” — “das Be-wegen hat sein Wesen im Er-eignen” (GA 74, 46). As Heidegger explains, this way-making “no longer means merely transporting something on a way that is already at hand; rather, it means rendering the way to . . . in the first place, thus being the way (BW, 418).” (53-54; The last ellipsis is Heidegger’s)

If the above represents Ziarek’s claims about what Language does, how might someone respond to Language? To be thoughtfully aware of Language and its way-making means listening and thinking “poietically.” What one listens to and thinks through are not concepts or the meanings of words taken as Aristotle’s ϕωναί σημαντικαί or Aquinas’ voces significativae, since these could never signify the movement of Language. Rather, it entails listening to and thinking through certain special words (including Heidegger’s own term Ereignis) that specifically instantiate the event of Language’s “Utterance” (Sage), i.e., the Word’s coming-to-word.

All of this requires transforming philosophy, which is concerned with the meaning of things, into “a new thinking” and a “new style” that focuses on Language as the source of all meaning. In fact it requires a “transformation of language” (sometimes called a “transformation of our relation to language”) whereby we learn to work back from words as merely semantic marks to the poietic emergence of Word itself. In another formulation, we must “displace man into the wake of Ereignis.”

The uniqueness, and difficulty, of Ziarek’s approach

To begin with, Ziarek is adamant that in his later reflections on language Heidegger does not present arguments and does not operate via concepts or the straightforward signification of words. This makes it a bit hard on readers who prefer their philosophy with just a dash of evidence and argumentation; but Ziarek might say that making such a demand of the later Heidegger is a category mistake. Ziarek’s own approach requires us, if we hope to understand and fully appreciate both Heidegger and Ziarek, to undergo a radical transformation of our own relation to language, something that the book itself performs.

The way Ziarek gets at Heidegger’s later philosophy of language is by working through Heidegger’s German words and sentences, including his peculiar (some might say quirky) use of etymologies, archaicisms, neologisms, tautologies, and what Ziarek calls “innovative scriptings” and “scriptural inventions.” This approach gets pretty deep into the linguistic weeds. For example, Ziarek gives considerable attention to Heidegger’s use of prefixes: he studies in great detail how Heidegger employs an-, zu-, ent-, ver-, er-, aus-, etc. He even analyzes Heidegger’s use of the word “the.” He also gives considerable attention to Heidegger’s employment of hyphens (something that years ago William J. Richardson dubbed Heideggerian “hyphenitis”).

This original and unique approach is, of course, consonant with Ziarek’s own training and expertise in literature, and those who know his work are familiar with his dazzling way with words. But those who are trained in philosophy and specifically in phenomenology may find that the dazzle doesn’t always help clarify what Heidegger was getting at. What to make, for example, of this explanation of Heidegger’s phrase “alles Wesen ist Wesung” (perhaps: “All ‘essence’ is a coming-into-presence”):

In other words, the only way the proper can come to be proper(ly) is precisely through the singular one-in-fold (Einfalt), which means that it occurs as intrinsically futural and open. When the event [= Ereignis] is thought of in terms of folds, the relatedness unfolding from the event is marked by this spatiotemporal span and its intrinsic futurity. The scope of such relatedness can be suggested by paraphrasing Heidegger in the following way: the onefold unfolds its singular infold as co-folds — time/space, being/language, words/signs — to suggest the reverberations of the play of Einfalt and Gefalt. (28)

A paraphrase is usually employed to make a difficult text more accessible. Here, however, it explains ignotum per ignotius. Isn’t Heidegger’s philosophy, and especially his later work, hard enough as it is? Couldn’t Ziarek have expressed these matters a bit more straightforwardly and a tad more clearly?

Heidegger scholarship is in crisis these days, and not just because his anti-Semitism has recently been put on full display. The crisis, rather, is that almost ninety years after his major work was published and sixty years after his best work was finished, Heidegger scholars still cannot agree on what he was driving at. Much of the problem lies with Heidegger’s idiosyncratic language — including the philosophical language he used to analyze language. Regarding the book under review here, the problem lies with the equally obscure rhetoric it employs to explain what Heidegger allegedly meant.