Language Alone: The Critical Fetish of Modernity

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Harpham, Geoffrey Galt, Language Alone: The Critical Fetish of Modernity, Routledge, 2002, 261pp, $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415942195.

Reviewed by R. M. Berry, Florida State University


Geoffrey Harpham’s Language Alone is an ambitious attempt to critique the “linguistic turn” of 20th-century thinking and thereby transform it. His provocative thesis is that while various intellectual disciplines and artistic fields sought throughout the century to make themselves more systematic through reliance upon the study of language, language as an object of knowledge became increasingly problematic. Harpham sets out both to document this reliance and to reveal its self-defeating character. Partly, his project is a debunking, a demonstration that language as the organizing center of modernist and postmodern thought is an illusion. As he states in his preface, “Nothing meaningful … can be said about language as such, both because language ‘as such’ is not available for direct observation and because the features, aspects, characteristics, and qualities that can be attributed to language approach the infinite” (ix). Beginning with 20th-century philosophy—both continental (Heidegger, Derrida) and Anglo-American (Russell, Wittgenstein, Rorty)—and working through linguistics (Saussure, Sapir, Whorf, Chomsky), critical theory (Foucault, Kristeva, Lyotard, Irigaray), Marxism and Post-Marxism (Volosinov, Gramsci, Laclau and Mouffe), cultural criticism (Raymond Williams, Stuart Hall), and ethical philosophy (Hume to Levinas), Harpham argues that the “linguistic turn” was essential to the modern development of each field, while proving ultimately a source of incoherence. The reason for this double bind, according to Harpham, is that language is “an imponderably vast, contradictory, and amorphous mass that defeats rational inquiry by its unsorted immensity” (56), necessitating a “reduction” to a limited subset of features in order to be studied. “This reduction then serves as the actual object of inquiry, even while the general term language is retained.” The result is a logical circularity that attempts both to preserve its constricted object and to make it appear all-inclusive. Wherever language is the object of study, there remains a large question of what, if anything, is being studied.

At times it is unclear whether Harpham’s book is itself a clarification of this confusion or a symptom of it. Although Harpham claims to be analyzing a problem posed by language as such, not merely by one reductive characterization of it, his provocative claims appear most obviously right for Saussurean linguistics and the intellectual projects developing from it. The heart of Saussure’s influence, according to Harpham, was his requirement that linguistics must begin with “an absolutely ruthless delimitation of its field” (20). This elimination of everything putatively external to language (e.g., biology, political history, culture) became the constitutive condition for all linguistic knowledge, for a science of language. “Considered as a system of signs, language was rational structure, a complex but orderly game, a vast grid of relational positions” (22), and this pure systematicity, abstracted from all accidental or historical contingencies, was the quality that other fields found attractive in Saussure’s work. Although Harpham wishes to cast doubt on this delimitation of language, arguing that it necessarily provokes a return of language’s repressed exterior, his most sweepingly skeptical claims seem applicable only to language delimited in just this way: “language—considered as a limited entity with a determined essence that can be revealed by observation and inference—does not exist and has been invented” (216).

This produces a peculiar wobble in Harpham’s account. Harpham stresses that he is aware, as literary criticism in general is not, of Saussure’s long obsolescence in the field of linguistics, recurring repeatedly to Chomsky as the field’s formative influence and devoting considerable attention to linguists, such as Roy Harris, who consider Saussure’s langue sheerest mythology. There are even moments in which Harpham’s book sounds almost like an apology for Chomskian linguistics, especially for its return to the vexed question of language’s relation to human nature. Harpham gives special attention to Chomsky’s dismissal of language as such, emphasizing his remark that “there is nothing in the real world corresponding to language” (55) and concluding that “language is not in fact the subject of Chomsky’s linguistics” (224)—sentences that suggest a deep consonance between Chomsky’s thought and Harpham’s own thesis. However, Harpham is in the end no more satisfied with “universal grammar” than with Saussure’s langue, accusing Chomsky of a reduction as ruthless as his predecessor’s. As a basis for linguistic investigation, human nature turns out to be just as amorphous and uncircumscribed as language itself, threatening in Harpham’s concluding chapter a similarly disastrous invasion by its repressed outside, non-human nature.

This recurrence in Chomskian linguistics of the problematic Saussurean delimitation seems uncanny. It is as though Saussure’s “ruthless” gesture, with its predictable self-defeat, had somehow insinuated itself into the very nature of reality. But what necessitates this recurrence is Harpham’s unwavering acceptance of Saussure’s epistemological requirement. For Harpham, just as much as for Saussure, the pre-modern study of language extracts itself from disorder and undisciplined speculation only by constituting language as “an object of external and objective knowledge that cannot be confused with the knower” (223). Nothing without this sharply delimited and self-identical fixity will count for Harpham as the subject of linguistics: “If language were the sort of thing that could be changed at will, it would not be worth changing: and any segment or dimension of it that can be altered at will does not deserve the general name of language” (215). As a result, Harpham’s book is at its most strained and unconvincing when discussing figures such as Heidegger, Gadamer, or Wittgenstein who have investigated the limits of this epistemological requirement, and at its least tendentious and most insightful in treating figures such as Derrida or Laclau and Mouffe whose reliance on Saussure is explicit. Although Harpham’s own model of absent center and repressed margin seems Derridean, he is not reluctant to expose Derrida’s account of language as itself a paradigmatic instance of his “law of return.” Harpham points out that Derrida’s early writings attempted to overcome metaphysical illusion, not through rigorous theoretical critique, but rather through “the antitheoretical, antimetaphysical properties of language itself” (35). In Husserl’s analysis of language, Derrida believed he discovered an “irreducible complicity” that continually resisted the very clarity Husserl sought. On the one hand, Harpham believes this complicity served as “a warning to any who would attempt to impose a false clarity on language by attempting to define and delimit it” (35), but on the other, it suggested a peculiar quality internal to language that enabled this resistance. This quality was différance.

Developing as a radicalization of Saussure’s system of differences, Derrida’s neologism seemed to represent both the ultimate reduction, a linguistic object wholly without positivity, and also the maximal inclusion, an internalization of the external as such. In this way différance did the work of a linguistic essence without any of its repressive consequences. But Harpham points out that what différance managed to avoid in concreteness and objectivity, it reacquired as force. Cataloguing the numerous active verbs Derrida used to describe différance, Harpham suggests that Derrida’s vision of language is characteristic of 20th century thought generally, reflecting a tendency among modern intellectuals (e.g., Heidegger, Whorf, Foucault, de Man) to subordinate their own agency to a vision of language as self-governing, autonomous power. As such, language functioned for modernism “as an exemplary fetish” (66). As a quasi-magical object capable of substituting for painful realities the 20th century preferred not to acknowledge, “language has ‘protected’ human beings from full self-recognition and shielded us from the consequences of our own behavior,” specifically, from those human and environmental catastrophes with which the century has been strewn. By fetishizing language in this way, “we are refusing to confront not just the human capacity for rapacity, destruction, or cruelty, but also the disturbing possibility that there is ‘nothing’ there, that there is no special human being or character, no divine species dispensation, no metaphysical difference between human nature and the rest of nature” (66).

It is this emphasis on repressed moral and political knowledge that introduces the two long excurses on ideology and ethics which make up the bulk of Harpham’s book. Harpham is at his most interesting in explaining how confusions in the Marxist theory of ideology were from their inception bound up with the specific account of language that Saussure inherited. Beginning with the “ideologues” of the French Enlightenment, Harpham recounts the various ways in which ideology and language were each conceived as “a socially determined system of meanings, a collective invention that informed the consciousness of the individual without ever itself, being fully conscious in any individual” (89). This unstable mélange of organic consciousness and false consciousness, of a signification system wholly immanent in society but somehow functioning autonomously through laws of its own, was the nineteenth century model of ideology that Saussure took over and renamed “linguistics.” As a result, when the vagaries and self-contradictions of Marx’s materialism became insurmountable, Saussure’s putative breakthrough seemed to offer the perfect solution, a scientific account of ideology’s material basis that seemed already to embody ideology’s contradictory characteristics. “After Saussure, it became all but impossible to think of ideology without thinking of language, and of language as Saussure defined it” (89).

Harpham’s interpretation of post-Marxist theory turns on the centrality of Saussurean linguistics to the efforts by Volosinov, Gramsci, Raymond Williams, Stuart Hall, Althusser, and Laclau and Mouffe to preserve ideology from Marx’s mechanistic determinism. Predictably, Harpham discovers in their work the same problem of delimitation that he earlier discovered in philosophy, but with this difference, that now the limits of Saussure’s reductive model are what the theory of ideology explicitly seeks to escape. For Volosinov and Williams, Saussure’s theory of an autonomously functioning sign system suppressed language’s role as, in Volosinov’s formulation, “an arena of the class struggle” (quoted, 92). Conceived instead as “a material social practice,” language reveals, not independently operating laws, but a dynamic relation between itself and the historical and cultural factors Saussure excluded, one in which, according to Williams, “social processes (are) at the heart of signification itself” (94). In this way, the self-identical clarity of Saussure’s linguistic object becomes fundamentally dispelled. The problem with the resulting blurriness, according to Harpham, is not just that it sacrifices the politically crucial distinction between ideology and meaning per se, but that it jettisons the very concreteness on which Volosinov and Williams’s critique of Marx depends. Williams’s attack on Marx’s attempt to reduce mind to matter turns on the necessity of thought’s expression in “unarguably physical and material ways: in voices, sounds” (quoted, 98). It is this hardening of thought into language, now conceived not as a dynamism or process but as so many material objects, that enables Williams to speak of class consciousness and cultural systems “as if they were concrete and observable entities” (98).

Harpham locates a similar self-defeating vagueness in the linguistic foundation of Gramsci’s concept of hegemony, while in Laclau and Mouffe’s explicitly Saussurean reinterpretation of Marx, he uncovers an exemplary instance of his own “law of return.” Attempting to theorize society in terms of Saussure’s “laws of language,” Laclau and Mouffe argue that the split between signifier and signified necessitates a purely relational democracy, one in which the only reality is positional, the center is absent, and no identity is ever identical with itself. Their problem thus becomes the mirror opposite of Volosinov and Williams’s. They must preserve language as itself “an unsubverted, unconstructed, intelligible object” (116) so that it can produce effects that are as dynamic and indeterminable as Williams’s “processes.” In other words, deriving an essential non-identity from Saussure’s “law” requires, “in a world of antagonistic relations, one shining, fully integrated thing—language alone” (116). This paradoxical necessity, not merely in Laclau and Mouffe but in all accounts of ideology, of a linguistic object that will take upon itself the organic-autonomous contradiction, remaining simultaneously concrete and ubiquitous, immanent and distinct, systematic and ever-changing, seems a perfect—almost too perfect—exemplification of Harpham’s thesis.

What seems missing is any consideration of the conditions necessitating this contradictory characterization, not just in Marxism, but also in Harpham’s own book. For Harpham, of course, what necessitates such contradictoriness is simply the nature of language itself, that “imponderably vast, contradictory, and amorphous mass,” but this conviction seems increasingly tendentious and unconvincing when the topic shifts in Harpham’s final section to ethics. Harpham is again helpful and insightful in tracing the ways that the discussion of language, from the Enlightenment through postmodernity, has been bound up with critical investigations of morality, so bound up, in fact, that a deep and mutually implicating relation of the kind his thesis imagines seems all but inevitable. However, it is his attempt to establish this relation as inescapably contradictory and self-defeating that exposes the seams of his argument. Again and again in writings of both continental and Anglo-American philosophers, Harpham locates either an unvoiced requirement of linguistic delimitation or, wherever a thinker is indifferent or hostile to such a requirement, a naive and unsystematic undertaking. So, noting Bernard Williams’s characterization of R. M. Hare’s focus on explicitly moral language as too narrow, Harpham accuses Williams of an unacknowledged reduction of the same kind, merely one that focuses on another equally narrow subset of language. But the absence of any suggestion by Williams that his selected words (treachery, promise, courage, et al) represent the essence of language, or even that they represent a clearly demarcated system of ethical meaning, indicates to Harpham a failure of ambition, and he concludes by roundly criticizing Williams for abandoning the search for “any truly universal aspect of language” (152).

In this way, Harpham insinuates into the writings of such figures as Levinas, Gadamer, Habermas, Charles Taylor, and others, the irresolvable contradiction that his own analysis uncovers there. The obvious difficulty he faces is the scant influence of Saussurean linguistics on the field of ethical philosophy. Confronting thinkers for whom the notion of language as “an object of external and objective knowledge that cannot be confused with the knower” is not merely incoherent but superfluous, Harpham must try to demonstrate, against their stolid indifference, both the fundamental necessity for such a delimited object and also the impossibility of ever obtaining it. The result is a much weightier burden of argument than his inquiry is prepared to uphold. Despite the intelligence, erudition, and lucidity of Harpham’s readings of the canon of late 20th century critical theory, what remains inadequately described throughout Language Alone is the problem for which Saussure’s langue could actually be a solution. The amorphous and protean nature of this originating occasion allows Harpham to proceed as if the confusions Wittgenstein sought to elucidate and the violence Heidegger sought to dispel were both difficulties of more or less the same kind as that confronting the professionalization of linguistics. Without this haze about its origins, the delimited, concrete, and autonomous essence of language could not acquire its fetishistic power. Wherever such a delimited linguistic object has functioned as an implicit or explicit requirement of knowledge—that is, wherever words have been conceived as signifiers—Harpham’s thesis proves incisive and illuminating, but where no such requirement is in evidence, it becomes Harpham’s own. Language Alone can remain instructive in such cases, but only by exemplifying the critical fetish of modernity, not by exposing it.