Language and Enlightenment: The Berlin Debates of the Eighteenth Century

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Avi Lifschitz, Language and Enlightenment: The Berlin Debates of the Eighteenth Century, Oxford University Press, 2012, 231pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199661664.

Reviewed by Corey W. Dyck, University of Western Ontario


For its essay competition of 1771, the Berlin Academy of Sciences sought responses to the questions "Supposing men abandoned to their natural faculties, are they in a position to invent language? And by what means will they arrive at this invention?" As is well known, the winning essay was J. G. Herder's "On the Origin of Language." Less well known, however, is that this competition was actually the second the Academy  devoted to the topic of language. The first contest, held in 1759, was on the question: "What is the reciprocal influence of the opinions of people on language, and of language on opinions?" The prize in that competition was awarded to the orientalist Johann David Michaelis. It is the first contest that provides the main topic for Avi Lifschitz's lucid and engaging book, as he considers the historical, philosophical, and political circumstances that led to its proposal and the broader scholarly views of the now little-known (among historians of philosophy) prize-winner.

The initial chapters in Language and Enlightenment are devoted to disentangling two distinct but related questions concerning language that were widely debated in the 18th century. The first, "diachronic" question has to do with the issue of the origin of language, and in particular whether the emergence of language can be accounted for naturalistically (in a manner inspired by Epicurean theory) or whether divine agency must at some point be invoked. The second, "synchronic" question concerns "the reciprocal relationship between linguistic signs and human cognition" (p. 12), that is, how language and thought mutually influence one another. While these questions are conceptually distinct, Lifschitz stresses that they were not neatly separated by thinkers in this period but rather formed two sides of a single theoretical investigation into language (such that, for instance, many submissions to the 1759 competition focused on the diachronic question to the exclusion of the synchronic one that is its express topic).

With respect to these issues, Lifschitz briefly surveys the well-known discussions on the part of major early Modern thinkers, including Hobbes, Locke, Condillac, and Rousseau. In addition, Lifschitz considers the German contributions on these topics and documents what he characterizes as a "wide-ranging focus on language" (p. 64), and particularly a focus on the synchronic relation between signs and thoughts that he takes to be evident in German philosophy, aesthetics, history, and theology in the first half of the 18th century. Lifschitz's presentation of the views of Leibniz, Wolff, the Baumgartens, among other (even) more minor figures on this score is certainly illuminating, yet I suspect that most would be struck by how little sustained and sophisticated philosophical treatment is actually devoted to language among German thinkers in this period (a legacy apparently inherited by Kant), at least in comparison with their more prestigious contemporaries. Wolff, for instance, allows for a close connection between reason and the use of language (the former is a condition of the latter),[1] follows Locke by including a chapter on signs in his German Logic, yet shows little interest in the philosophical issues that occupied and would occupy English and French thinkers, as his real focus remains on the ideas and mental acts that underlie and give rise to words and propositions. Rather than cultivating a philosophical interest in language, it seems that these early German thinkers took a more straightforwardly cultural interest in promoting the German language, a goal that perhaps presumes a sort of interrelation of language and opinion but at any rate did not lead them to subject this interrelation to any serious scrutiny.

Part, I think, of what leads Lifschitz to overstate the importance of language for early German thinkers is the close connection he asserts between clear but indistinct ideas and symbolic cognition (cf. p. 41, where he refers to the latter as a "related epistemic act"), in accordance with which he considers the rehabilitation of the confused ideas (most famously in Alexander Baumgarten's Aesthetica) as evidence of a growing interest in language. That such a connection obtains is, however, far from clear: in his best-known account, Leibniz characterizes symbolic cognition as a way in which a distinctidea is known adequately, but where signs (including words) are used to represent parts of that concept without grasping their precise meaning (and so they are at that time grasped only obscurely).[2] This is only to say, then, that during the course of a "lengthy analysis" of a complex concept it may be necessary (due to our cognitive limitations) to deploy a sign (whether linguistic or mathematical) without focusing on its meaning, and not, as Lifschitz claims, that "in their perception of most ideas human beings [make] use of blind or symbolic cognition" (p. 43, my emphasis).

While one might thus quibble with Lifschitz's attempt to find deep roots in the Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy for the 1759 Academy question, there is no doubting that in the distinctive milieu in Berlin of the 1750s a number of thinkers took an active interest in language, its role in framing social institutions, and its relation to the mind, primarily under the influence of the work of Condillac and Rousseau. These include the president of the Academy, Pierre Louis Moreau de Maupertuis (who wrote a number of papers on language and its origin), Moses Mendelssohn (who translated Rousseau's Discours sur l'inégalité into German, with an accompanying critical essay, in 1756), and Johann Peter Süssmilch (whose rebuttals of Maupertuis were delivered in 1756 but published in 1766). Alongside these discussions of the origin of language, Lifschitz shows that there was lively internal discussion among Academy members regarding the (synchronic) connection between language and opinions, particularly regarding the contentious choice of French as the language of the Academy.

This is all to say that already in the 1750s and well before the Academy competition of 1771, mainstream Enlightenment figures recognized the "linguistic rootedness of all human forms of life" and the importance of language as a "tool of cognition" (p. 6). That this is so, Lifschitz rightly contends, constitutes a significant challenge to the view that such an interest in language, with its accompanying focus on the historical and non-rational aspects of human nature, was proper to the figures of the counter-Enlightenment, such as Herder and Hamann. As Lifschitz contends, this amounts to a direct challenge to the characterization of the counter-Enlightenment presented in Isaiah Berlin's seminal studies. It also challenges more recent contributions, such as Michael Forster's work on Herder's philosophy of language. Lifschitz can be taken to show that Herder's claim, as characterized by Forster, that "thought is essentially dependent upon and bounded by language" and that "one cannot think unless one has a language and one can only think what one can express linguistically"[3] must be taken in the broader context of these earlier philosophical (and political) debates. For these reasons, Lifschitz's deft treatment of the complex debates taking place in Berlin in the 1750s is, I think, the most rewarding part of this book.

These various currents of discussion are shown to come together in Michaelis' prize-winning essay (published in 1759 in French translation as Dissertation . . . sur l'influence réciproque du langage sur les opinions, et des opinions sur le langage). The Dissertation is anything but the dry contribution of a biblical scholar. Michaelis answers the Academy's question by attacking the linguistic barbarisms of scholars and scientists and championing the use of vernacular, in contrast to efforts on the part of theorists since Leibniz to craft a universal language. Notably, Michaelis offers an account of the development of language that is attentive to the key role played by historical accident and even compares the authority of the individual with respect to influencing the growth of language to that of a citizen in a democratic state. With respect to the specific issue of the mutual influence of language and opinions, Michaelis offers a view of language as a sort of archive that encodes the history of a nation's opinions (both true and false), which are accessible through the use of etymology. This account emphasizes the contingency of the development of language as well as its indispensability for thought. In light of this, it is unsurprising that Michaelis' essay served as a catalyst for wider discussion and more intense interest in language among a number of major German thinkers. These included, as Lifschitz documents, Mendelssohn (who praised Michaelis but criticized the ambiguities of the question), Hamann (who wrote two critiques of the essay), and Herder (who in spite of criticism of Michaelis seems to have adopted a number of his positions (p. 175)).

All told, Lifschitz offers an eye-opening account of an episode in the history of German thought, which, though largely overlooked, clearly holds significant philosophical promise. While a philosophical audience will likely find it longer on historical detail and shorter on argumentative reconstruction than they are perhaps used to, it nonetheless serves to mark out some very promising territory for further investigation, and it is to be hoped that scholars interested in the philosophy of language and its history will take an interest in following up on this lively and provocative discussion.

[1] Christian Wolff, Vernünfftige Gedancken von Gott, der Welt und der Seele des Menschen, auch allen Dingen überhaupt or Deutsche Metaphysik, 11th ed. (Halle: 1751), §867.

[2] See G. W. Leibniz, Philosophical Essays, ed. and trans. R. Ariew and D. Garber (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989), 24-5.

[3] See Forster, After Herder (Oxford: Oxford UP, 2010), 56.