Language and Learning: Philosophy of Language in the Hellenistic Age

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Dorothea Frede and Brad Inwood (eds.), Language and Learning: Philosophy of Language in the Hellenistic Age, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 366pp, $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 052184181X.

Reviewed by Victor Caston, University of Michigan


This extremely fine volume is the precipitate of the ninth Symposium Hellenisticum, held in Hamburg in July 2001. The Symposium, a highly selective triennial conference, has produced a string of excellent edited collections over the years, starting with Doubt and Dogmatism (1978/1980). In keeping with the tradition of alliterative two-noun titles, this volume is entitled Language and Learning and is devoted primarily to the philosophy of language in the Hellenistic period. Primarily, but not exclusively: three of the papers do not quite fit into that pigeon hole (despite the editors' best efforts in the preface). Such anomalies are not likely to disappoint anyone (except perhaps marketing types at the publishers), given the overall high standard of the contributions and the intrinsic interest of the topics. Unlike its older sister, the Symposium Aristotelicum, moreover, the Symposium Hellenisticum has always emphasized younger scholars, which has helped to sustain the health and vigor of the field. The present volume is no exception: it includes only two of the great lions in this area, though it is clear from the preface that virtually all of the significant figures were present at the meetings themselves (ix). Like earlier volumes in this series, Language and Learning will clearly be important to anyone who takes an interest in the philosophy of the period.

James Allen offers a wonderful philosophical exploration of the Stoic view that language is natural in origin. Much hinges here on how we understand the contrast with 'conventional' (18-20). The crucial question, as in Plato's Cratylus, is whether there is any standard of correctness for names beyond convention, that is, beyond the mere agreement (sunthêkê) of people who share a language, and in particular whether it involves some natural relation. Both the Stoics and the Cratylus answer this question in the affirmative. But this does not exclude convention entirely. Both theories assume that names are also conventional, in so far as they hold that there was some original "imposition" or deliberate assigning (thesis) of names. This contrasts with the Epicureans, who believe that initially names erupted from humans spontaneously, without forethought. Because of this, Allen points out, the Stoics' naturalism can allow that some acts of imposition occur "at a relatively advanced stage" in the development of human societies, instead of all having to be performed before "a mute population unversed in linguistic activity of any kind" (26). But even as regards correctness, there is room for convention. Must a standard of correctness be "prior to and independent of" humans' use of names (23) to be natural? Or is the use of language itself something natural for human beings, like the development of reason (logos), as the Stoics surely believe (26-7)? One might worry that this threatens to make all convention natural and by this more liberal natural standard of correctness, "anything goes." But Allen's account is able to answer this, even though he does not explicitly address it. What makes a given name correct, he conjectures, is that it is naturally suited to the aims of naturally rational beings like humans, who first imposed them (28); and though this standard certainly allows great latitude, plainly not all names will meet it. If the Stoics adopted this sort of flexible standard, it would help explain why they do not rely on resemblance as a single natural standard by which all names should be judged, as Socrates does in the Cratylus, and consequently why they do not make even the limited epistemic claims on behalf of etymology that Socrates does (30-34). Given the meagerness of the ancient testimony, such conjecture is unavoidable, and some will no doubt favor other proposals. What makes this essay so valuable is the nuanced way in which it maps the conceptual space and points to exegetical openings that have not generally been exploited.

The Stoics' views on language are also the subject of A. A. Long's fine paper. He argues that the Stoics' reliance on Plato's Cratylus is even closer: parts of their linguistic theory "can be interpreted as a revisionary reading of the Cratylus," in an effort to make Socrates' proposals "much more coherent" (37). The most striking parallel is their appeal to etymology, especially for divine names: here there does seem to be an assumption that some hidden insights can be recovered from names (38). The Stoic etymologies are not "Heraclitean" in the way that those in the Cratylus are, Long notes, but this may be an improvement, in so far as they are Heraclitean in a Stoic sense (39-40). Another point where the Stoics improved on the Cratylus account, according to Long, is the resemblance of primary names to their nominata, by relaxing Socrates' demand for similarity and introducing other natural relations like proximity and opposition (41-2). Long goes further, though, and argues that a revisionary reading of the Cratylus is part of the inspiration for other Stoic distinctions as well: between sign and signification, expressions and sentences, word-meaning and speaker-meaning. The parallels here are somewhat weaker. It seems a bit of a stretch, at any rate, to claim that Socrates' "formal naturalism … surely points in the direction of Stoic lekta and their distinctness as semantic and logical items from the alphabetic constituents of language." (47) Long concludes with a valuable outline of chapter 5 of Augustine's De dialectica, with annotations, including some very suggestive remarks about the use of the crucial term 'dicibile' (49-55).

Alexander Verlinsky examines in close detail the testimony for the Epicurean views on the origin of language. He first examines contemporaneous accounts, as well as those found in Diodorus Siculus, Vitruvius and Lactantius, carefully noting the differences from the Epicurean version (58-63). In his analysis of Epicurus' Letter to Herodotus 75-6, he opts for a two-stage analysis: he argues that the assignment of words to objects belongs to the first stage, even if subsequent to the initial spontaneous expressions of articulate sound (65-71); and that while there are some new names introduced in the second "rational" stage, it is primarily occupied with refining and revising existing names (71-7). (There is an interesting examination of Ptolemy's discussion of the second stage in On the Criterion on pp. 72-5.) The same two-stage process holds even for more abstract, accidental properties of things, although in this case without a corresponding prolepsis (77-83). Verlinsky goes on to subdivide the first stage still further, into a historical development from pre-verbal signifying gestures to signifying utterances, via emotive utterances and the subsequent recognition of their utility, based on accounts in Lucretius and Agatharcides, which have often been thought instead to concern ontogenetic development (83-98). The level of detailed argument in this article is extremely useful.

Catherine Atherton is also concerned with Epicurean theories on the origin of language, but takes a more philosophical tack and limits herself just to Lucretius, whom she wants to take on his own terms. This choice is especially interesting because many important details in Epicurus' account receive little or no mention in Lucretius (103-9). But the two philosophical challenges she poses for Lucretius' account, she claims, would also hold for Epicurus and indeed for today's defenders of the natural origins of language as well (109). The first challenge is that this sort of account, with its emphasis on emotional expressiveness, is not in a position to explain how communication first arises (114-29). Communication is not merely informative behavior. It necessarily involves an intention to inform the hearer and is therefore controlled and deliberate. But the initial vocalizations of human beings that Lucretius describes are not like this, but rather are compelled by nature; in fact, this is an essential feature of all such theories (see esp. 127-8). One might think that the relevant intentions arise from our subsequent reflections on this process, and Lucretius does claim that we later come to recognize the utility of making articulate vocalizations. But this gives rise to the second challenge, which "poses one of the gravest threats to the whole Epicurean case for a natural origin for language" (110). For such recognition presupposes that we are already using such vocalizations intentionally as signs, the very thing we were hoping to explain (129-37, esp. 132-4). It is not clear to me just how threatening these challenges actually are. The first seems to derive largely from Atherton's dissatisfaction with the Epicurean account of volition, rather than their account of language per se; and there is no reason given to think that this is a fault of naturalistic theories generally. And Atherton herself suggests a way in which Lucretius might have answered the second challenge, namely, by holding that signifying behavior is somehow instinctive, rather than emergent (134-6). But on each of these points, Atherton no doubt has more to say: the notes suggest that she is writing a book on the subject. Given the very high caliber of philosophical discussion in this article, it will be more than worth the wait.

The next piece, by Ineke Sluiter, focuses not on linguistic theory, but on communicative practice and the way in which the Cynics' transgressive behavior is deployed together with their verbal remarks to achieve maximum effect. It is a persuasive and artful (and amusing) article, however much it transgresses the rubric "language and learning."

Charles Brittain's paper also does not squarely fall in the designated area. His focus is, in effect, conceptual analysis and the question of what authority ordinary speakers' conceptions possess. The topic is vast and complex, and here one hopes that there is a book project in the works, since it is likely to revise, and enrich, our understanding of the history in illuminating ways. Brittain's overarching theme is the development of a "theory of common sense" in antiquity, that is, a theory which takes ordinary conceptions to have some "general and immediate relation" to "the essential nature of the world" and so provide us with an important source and standard for knowledge. Such a theory, he maintains, was not possible before the Stoic view that all humans are essentially rational. The first such theory is not to be found in Stoicism, but in Cicero's "transformation" of the Stoic theory of common conceptions in his later rhetorical works (164, 167, 199-209). Brittain claims only to offer "some fragments" of this history here (165). But even so, he covers a wide range of important topics, with many detailed observations, including the Stoics' views on meaning (166-8), concepts and preconceptions (168-74), so-called common conceptions (175-85), and definition (186-91); a distinct later tradition which speaks of conceptual or "ennoematic" definitions and the question of a connection to Stoic antecedents, answered in the negative (191-9); and the modification of Stoic views on definition in Cicero's later rhetorical works that make possible a genuine "theory of common sense" (199-209). Those interested in the theory itself will have to wait for the book, since Brittain's aim here is only to discern the origins and antecedents of the theory. But a significant value of the article, at least for this reader, lies in the spadework and detailed observations Brittain provides on Stoic views on the nature of concepts, a topic crucial to their epistemology, but on which there has not been enough good work to date.

David Blank's piece, "Varro's anti-analogist," concerns the source of the arguments in Varro's De lingua latina against analogy in the inflection of words. Crates of Mallos has often been thought to be the source, and this conjecture has been used to argue that there was a dispute over just this point between Crates' circle in Pergamum and Aristarchus' in Alexandria. Blank argues lucidly and compellingly against this through a close reading of Varro. He shows that while Crates is invoked as someone who disagrees with Aristarchus' use of analogy, he is cited as an analogist, to show that the analogists disagree amongst themselves, in order to discredit the general approach (211-12, 225-36); and in fact our other evidence about Crates suggests that he was very much a grammarian like Aristarchus, whatever their disagreements (221-3). In contrast, Varro's anti-analogist does not seem to be a grammarian at all, but rather someone who, like Sextus Empiricus, rejects grammar's claims to be a science at all. Blank conjectures that the empiricist arguments of Book 8 derive from Epicurean sources (218, 237-8).

In "The Stoics on fallacies of equivocation," Susanne Bobzien offers a detailed and illuminating study of the Stoics' treatment of sophismata involving homonymy, including a comparison with Aristotle's treatment. What makes these sophismata particularly interesting (as C. Atherton had shown previously) is that equivocation is not something that can occur at the level of propositions and arguments, but crucially involves the relation between sentences and propositions (248-9). On Bobzien's analysis, the Stoics take expressions that are ambiguous on their own to be disambiguated by context, without appealing to any psychological process of disambiguation on the part of the speaker or hearer: given the sentence in which it is embedded and the context in which it is uttered, an expression will generally signify only one of its meanings on a given occasion (251-3). Accordingly, the hearer can accept each of the premises of the sophisma on its own, while objecting to the drawing of the inference, since it is only then that an unwarranted shift in signification occurs (254-5), at which point the hearer should remain "silent," by openly refusing to respond. (Bobzien is most in disagreement with Atherton on the question of "silence," see esp. 264-71.) Aristotle, in contrast, takes the premise itself to be ambiguous and accordingly advises that the hearer object to it immediately (258-63). This paper, together with Bobzien's other papers on Stoic treatments of sophismata (the Sorites and the Horned man) lead one to hope that there is also a full-scale book treatment in the works here. Given how meticulous and penetrating her analyses are, this would no doubt be a major contribution to the field.

In "What is a disjunction?", Jonathan Barnes is principally concerned with Stoic views on connectives, as they appear in two later and difficult discussions, one from Apollonius Dyscolus, the other Galen (for which he provides the Greek, 294-8). The investigation is conducted with Barnes' characteristic brio and incisiveness; and as is often the case, it is highly instructive. Since the Stoics regard disjunctions as stating alternatives, they not only favor an exclusive reading of 'or', but also insist that there must be some form of "conflict" between the alternatives. Apollonius distinguishes between "natural" alternatives -- that is, where there is some genuine incompatibility -- and those which are not, but only alternatives "relative to an occasion" (280-5). There is some reason to think the distinction is originally Stoic, Barnes suggests, and he explores the possibility that the only true disjunctions for the Stoics are those stating natural alternatives (285-8). In Galen's case, the difficulty is to make sense of his criticisms of the Stoics on negated conjunctions (and their ramifications for Stoic views on disjunctions). Here Barnes gives as sympathetic a reading as could be hoped for (288-94).

The title of Sten Ebbesen's paper suggests that it will connect Hellenistic discussions with those in the high Middle Ages, and this expectation is reinforced by the editors' claim that it examines "the influence" of Hellenistic philosophers and in particular the Stoics (12). The paper is in fact a genial and cursory examination of a few parallels (concerning "double" imposition, analogy, the emphasis on signification, 300-306). Much of the article is devoted to laying out the modist views of Boethius of Dacia (307-18). The parallels briefly adumbrated here (314), however, do not take us much further than the programmatic suspicion that Priscian got his ideas from Apollonius Dyscolus who got his ideas from the Stoics. No doubt there is truth in this. But what one really wants to see are details.

As both the Symposium Hellenisticum and the Symposium Aristotelicum have matured, their role and orientation has accordingly developed. But as this volume shows, the main value of these institutions continues to be the high standards they set for the field as a whole, a remarkable achievement for any series of edited volumes.