Language and the Structure of Berkeley's World

Placeholder book cover

Kenneth L. Pearce, Language and the Structure of Berkeley's World, Oxford University Press, 2017, 204pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198790334.

Reviewed by Melissa Frankel, Carleton University


In the Introduction, Pearce sets up a problem for Berkeleyan idealism: given Berkeley's view that fundamentally, only minds and ideas exist, and given that ideas are momentary and constantly changing objects of perception, how can Berkeley also be committed to the existence of a physical world that has structure -- a world of stable, persistent, unified objects that relate to one another in ways describable via natural laws? The problem is a familiar one to anyone with even a cursory knowledge of Berkeley and Berkeley scholarship; Pearce's solution, however, is far from familiar. He offers a bold, systematic reading of a number of Berkeley's texts[1] in which Berkeley's philosophy of language plays a central role, both in the arguments against (primarily Lockean and Cartesian) materialism, and also in the constructive account of physical bodies. The central theme, which recurs continually through the monograph, is one on which Berkeley forcefully rejects his contemporaries' reliance on a reference-based theory of meaning in favour of a proto-Wittgensteinian use-theory. The former is implicated in the rejection of materialism, and the latter provides structure to the Berkeleyan world. Pearce is a compelling writer, and this is a very rich book, full of both interesting textual analyses and interventions in particular scholarly debates, and with a strong story to tell about how to situate Berkeley both with respect to his contemporaries and also in the history of philosophy more generally. My brief discussion in what follows will not do justice to every aspect of the book, but I will attempt to pick out some of the most prominent threads.

In the opening chapters, Pearce sets up the central theme, first through a discussion of Berkeley's rejection of what Pearce calls the "Theory of Meaning" (henceforth, ToM) in chapter 1, and then in chapters 2 and 3 through a discussion of the positive account of language, which Pearce divides into an early account (largely found in the Manuscript Introduction to PHK, but also from PHK and DM) and a mature account (from Alc), which, though distinguished, are nonetheless largely continuous with one another. The ToM, which will be familiar to readers from Locke's Essay, but which Pearce shows can be found in a number of 17th century texts, holds roughly that a term is meaningful just in case it (fixedly) signifies an idea. That is, meanings are pre-linguistic mental items that get conventionally associated with particular terms. Berkeley's attack on the ToM is, Pearce notes, an attack both on the view that terms must be fixed, that is, that they must name ideas, and also an attack on the view that meanings can be pre-linguistic. This comes out primarily through a discussion of Berkeley's well-known polemic against abstract ideas (which, for the proponent of the ToM, are the meanings of general terms.) I will not go into the details of Pearce's argument here, except to say that he nicely synthesizes some of the insights from scholars who read Berkeley as providing an argument from introspection with insights from scholars who read Berkeley as relying on the principle that impossibility implies inconceivability to argue against abstract general ideas.

The main takeaway from chapter 1, for readers who are not so interested in this particular scholarly debate, is Pearce's contention that for Berkeley, the error of the proponent of the ToM is to hold that words name ideas, when in fact there can be meaningful bits of language that either do not name ideas or, indeed, that are not directly connected with ideas at all. Instead, as Pearce argues in the next chapters, Berkeley's ultimate view is that terms get to be meaningful via the provision of rules for their application. This is not, Pearce stresses, a claim that we must have "meta-linguistic beliefs" about these rules -- it is a claim that in so far as such rules exist, and in so far as we appropriately follow them, we use terms meaningfully. This allows Pearce to not only give an account of how, for Berkeley, general terms get to be meaningful without abstract general ideas -- via their association with rules that tell us how to use these terms to "'denote indifferently' any object that satisfies [their] definition" (33) -- but also to give a unified account of the meaningfulness of language which will also extend to other kinds of terms, e.g., scientific and religious terms.

This is an important intervention in Berkeley scholarship in so far as it speaks to the question of whether Berkeley admits a difference between cognitive and non-cognitive language: Pearce's answer is an emphatic no,[2] and he provides us with texts in which Berkeley clearly offers that scientific and religious language can be given parallel accounts, and also carefully explicates how the Berkeleyan theory works for such language. Terms like "force" -- but also "Trinity" -- are meaningful, not in so far as they necessarily designate particular ideas (as the proponent of ToM would have it), but because they play a particular role in our scientific and religious theorizing, which allows us to "accomplish some practical ends" (62). In the case of "force," the ends might have to do with calculations about motions, and in the case of "Trinity," with the influencing of our (moral) conduct.

Interestingly, although Pearce insists that for Berkeley terms don't acquire their meanings via reference to ideas, nonetheless he holds that Berkeley's theory has both "ideational" and "operative" aspects. Pearce attributes to Berkeley the view that all meaningful language will be associated with rules, but also that some of these rules "connect words to ideas." (63) Thus, although Pearce does not and would not say so, a kind of vestige of the ToM remains in his reading of the Berkeleyan account: at bottom, one cannot get meaningful language where there is no reference at all. Indeed, virtually all of the texts that Pearce offers in favour of the rule-based account are texts in which Berkeley still appeals to reference to some idea or other. (The one exception is a difficult text from Alc 7.17, in which Berkeley maintains that a term may be meaningful "even though there should be no possibility of offering or exhibiting any . . . idea to the mind" -- but Pearce suggests that even in this sort of case, the term is "indirectly" connected to ideas, by playing a role in a system of rules in which other terms connect to ideas.)

This, I think, is because Pearce's Berkeley is not merely interested in language as a formal system (or as a group of formal systems), but ultimately also wants language to hook onto reality -- to "pick out language-independent entities" (85).[3] Thus in chapter 5, Pearce moves to a discussion of both reference and of what he called "quasi-reference." Terms refer when they pick out genuine entities -- for Berkeley, referring terms can pick out ideas or minds/mental acts, since Berkeley, qua idealist, is committed only to the existence of ideas and minds.[4] But Pearce also argues that Berkeley allows for "quasi-referring expressions," which pick out what he calls "quasi-entities." Quasi-referring terms are ones like "force," which for Berkeley do not pick out actual motions but are nonetheless useful in a system of describing and calculating such motions. Pearce insists that these terms do not fail to refer altogether. Rather, they get to count as quasi-referring in virtue of the fact that the system in which they are embedded does contain genuinely referring terms, and that although they themselves do not refer to "things existing in nature waiting to be discovered . . . [they -- that is, quasi-entities -- are] artifacts of our theorizing . . . [i.e.,] theoretical constructs" (95).

Unsurprisingly, at least some religious language will also turn out to be quasi-referring, although it is important for Berkeley, on Pearce's account, that some religious terms -- perhaps most importantly, the term "God" -- also genuinely refer. What is more surprising and interesting, I think, is how Pearce uses the distinction between reference and quasi-reference to start answering the question with which he introduces his project: the question of how Berkeley can allow for the physical world to be structured. In chapter 6, which for me was one of the most interesting, we find Pearce arguing that although the term "idea" for Berkeley is a genuinely referring term, nonetheless, our body-terms are quasi-referring terms. Specifically, they play the role in our system of ideas of organizing those ideas for human purposes. Thus, they are not actual constructs, but theoretical constructs -- they allow us to unify differing ideas for different human purposes, but especially in the interest of allowing us to navigate bodily through a physical world. This then allows us to specify rules governing the application of terms such as "exists" and "same" to bodies, which will be different than the rules governing the application of those terms to ideas, and which will allow us to truthfully assert that bodies have certain properties (a certain structure) even when we cannot assert the same with respect to ideas -- e.g., bodies, unlike ideas, can exist (that is, we may properly apply the term "exist" to them) even when not currently perceived. Pearce does have to be a bit careful here, as he wants to claim not only that ideas can be given a structure by means of our organizing them into bodies, but also that that structure is not merely human-made but is grounded in some genuine fact about the world. Thus, in the closing chapter we find Pearce discussing the famous Berkeleyan claim that there is a language of nature -- for Pearce, Berkeley means this quite literally: "ideas [especially visual and tangible] are grammatically structured and serve a communicative purpose" (182), which is in part to reveal to us God and God's attributes.

What I have said thus far gives just a small flavour of the book, but one that I think reasonably captures its general thrust. This is a book with a bold agenda: it wants to retell the story of how Berkeley argues against materialism and for a structured idealist world, by appeal to one overriding theme, namely, the philosophy of language. In so doing, it centers what I agree with Pearce are important passages about how materialism relies on the erroneous doctrine of abstract general ideas, about talk of mind-independent material objects as being literally meaningless, and about the parallels between scientific and religious language -- these latter passages, especially, I think have often been unduly neglected. But in the interest of giving this coherent and unified story, emphasis is sometimes given to some sections of the text over others. So, for instance, because Pearce is focused on the connection between Berkeley's rejection of the ToM and his rejection of materialism, he zeroes in on the doctrine of material substratum as the primary locus of the Berkeleyan attack. He argues that for the proponent of the ToM, body terms must have fixed reference to a unique idea, but that since sensible qualities are consistently changing, those terms must refer to something beyond the sensible qualities -- something that unifies them, and on which they depend; hence the doctrine of material substratum.

Although the connection that Pearce draws here is plausible (that is: Pearce makes a plausible case that Berkeley read Locke and Descartes as arguing in this way, not that Locke and Descartes actually argued in this way), nonetheless the focus on material substratum, via the focus on ToM, leads Pearce to pay less attention to some other aspects of Berkeley's arguments against materialism. So, for instance, the arguments concerning the primary quality/secondary quality distinction fall to the periphery on Pearce's account; correspondingly, e.g., the perceptual relativity arguments from PHK and DHP play virtually no role in his discussion. I also thought that Berkeley's likeness principle was given rather short shrift, though it might have been relevant to some aspects of the argument, e.g., to Pearce's discussion of how we may genuinely refer to other minds/to the actions of others, which purportedly resemble our own, a discussion that I thought might reasonably have been expanded. Of course, no book on a philosopher is required to address every aspect of that philosopher's work, but I would be interested, at least, to read how such texts figure in Berkeley's overall argument, on Pearce's reading.

The book is also bold insofar as it argues forcefully for a reconsideration of Berkeley's place in the canon, such as it is. As Pearce writes in his introduction, on his reading, "Berkeley's philosophy would, in certain respects, be very much at home in the intellectual milieu of such thinkers as Wittgenstein and Quine" (4). The argument for this claim comes sometimes in the form of show and sometimes in the form of tell: Pearce, on the one hand, as I have discussed, carefully goes through texts to show Berkeley's endorsement of a rule-based use-theory of meaning; he also takes time, at various points in the book, to explicitly draw parallels between Berkeley and some of these 20th century philosophers.

My sense is that Pearce, in trying both to give a rereading of Berkeley and also to provide this argument for a reconsideration of Berkeley's historical importance, is perhaps being a bit overly ambitious. He moves between careful contextualist scholarship -- methodical and systematic selection and reading of texts, situation of Berkeley in historical context -- and these more wide-ranging claims about Berkeley's work relative to more contemporary accounts. Thus, I sometimes found that parts of the book moved at rather too fast a clip. As a Berkeley scholar, I was most interested in reading the details of some of the arguments, especially in so far as those figure in some of the scholarly debates in the Berkeley literature. However, although Pearce pays attention to those debates at some points (as e.g. in his discussion of Berkeley's polemic against abstract ideas), at other points he elides or curtails them in favour of the other focus of the book, that is, the connection with the 20th century.

In chapter 3, for instance, amid a discussion of various passages from Alciphron, Pearce engages in a fairly lengthy discussion of Ian Hacking's contention that no early modern philosopher had a theory of meaning in a contemporary sense, in so far as early modern theories of meaning are "primarily . . . theor[ies] of private mental discourse" (58). Given what I've said so far of Pearce's book, it should be no surprise that, although he agrees with Hacking's contention regarding Berkeley's contemporaries (and I wonder how Locke scholars might respond to this!), Pearce holds Berkeley out as a distinct exception. Although I found this discussion tremendously interesting, nonetheless I found it a bit distracting. That said, for readers who are not necessarily invested in some of the finer details of the secondary literature, I suspect that this dual project will be rather a virtue of the book.

Overall, then, this book is both a strong addition to Berkeley scholarship, and a compelling read to a more general philosophical audience, especially those with some interest in the history of philosophy, the history of ideas, or the philosophy of language.

[1] Pearce’s emphasis tends to be on the Principles of Human Knowledge (1710) and Alciphron (1732), but he brings in texts from almost the entire Berkeleyan corpus.  In what follows, following Pearce, I will use the following abbreviations for Berkeley’s texts: Alc for Alciphron, DHP for the Three Dialogues Between Hylas and Philonous, DM for De Motu, and PHK for the Principles.  To give the reader a sense of the intended scope of Pearce’s monograph, Pearce also (inter alia) discusses texts from Berkeley’s Analyst, from the New Theory of Vision and the Theory of Vision Vindicated, and from Siris.

[2] That said, he notes that “Berkeley does seem, at least at some points in his career, to have held some form of non-cognitivism about moral discourse” (44) – here Pearce has in mind especially passages that seem to connect morality with volition – but presumably he thinks that Berkeley abandons this at least by the time that he writes Alciphron.

[3] Pearce thus notes, somewhat in passing, that although Berkeley comes close to a proto-Carnapian view, unlike Carnap, he thinks that metaphysical questions about reality may be genuine questions (83).

[4] In chapter 7, Pearce discusses the case of mind-language at length.  He argues that for Berkeley, both mental-act terms but also the term “mind” must genuinely refer, since Berkeley takes minds (unlike bodies) to be substances.  Although I am sympathetic to this reading of Berkeley, it is a bit surprising that Pearce elides the scholarly debate about just how committed Berkeley was to the view that minds are substances.  In particular, I wonder whether a case might not be made for treating mind-terms as quasi-referring.  But I leave this point to the side.