Language, Form(s) of Life, and Logic: Investigations after Wittgenstein

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Christian Martin (ed.), Language, Form(s) of Life, and Logic: Investigations after Wittgenstein, De Gruyter, 2018, 334pp., $126.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783110516289.

Reviewed by Kristijan Krkač, Zagreb School of Economics and Management


This book's title (unlike some titles) accurately represents the excellent content of this collection of eleven papers and the editor's introduction. My overall impression is that most of the chapters are written with a similar level of expertise and precision on one hand, and with openness and creativity on the other. They naturally vary in topic, style, analyses, argumentation and conclusions. This is in part necessary since chapters in the first section deal with historical issues, the second with the relevance of form(s) of life in Wittgenstein's developed form-of-life-philosophy, and the third with applications and the possible future of the concept form of life (FOL). I will first discuss some elements of the logico-linguistic account of FOL, then move on to aspects of some of the papers, looking in most detail at those in the first section.

Although the concept FOL is explained in the Introduction, a more extensive exposition of this account seems needed. A reader not acquainted with all the accounts of FOL could get the impression that the logico-linguistic account (similar to the language-game account) is the dominant one. There are at least five quite different accounts that can be reduced to others and there are also borderline accounts; these are only considered by Christian Martin (in both his introduction and the chapter he wrote). The five accounts include: the cultural, anthropological or conceptual relativism account (by Cavell and Glock), the social account or the way of life account (by Bloor and Cavell), the language-game account (by von Wright, Schulte and Baker and Hacker), the behavior-package account (by Quine, Kripke and Hunter) and the organic or biological account (by Cavell, Hunter and Simpson), (summarized in Krkač, Lukin 2007: 112-4).

Although the logico-linguistic account of FOL in this collection partly corresponds to the language-game account, it differs from it by giving much more weight to early and transitional logical concepts such as the concept of an application. It would have been helpful had the book included a more detailed introduction, or at least a reference to some introductory notes and entries that point to further sources and debates.1 So, there was an additional reason to introduce the difference between the language-game account and the logico-linguistic account of FOLs. However, this is only a minor issue.

The main reason for such evaluation of the book lies in the basic argument of the whole account of FOL that it tries to explicate, make clear and argue for. That argument is quite simple. To put it briefly, the argument is that: it should count for something that the issue of linguistic meaning was a continuing interest of Wittgenstein's, in spite of the fact that in different periods his answers noticeably differed, i.e., in terms of logical analyses or of language-game perspicuous (re)presentations), at least according to some accounts. We should always bear in mind that his answers have primary linguistic content and contexts, and so far as this is the case, it seems correct to emphasize the logico-linguistic nature of FOLs. This is the basic and the most important reason why this collection is excellent and should be essential reading for anyone who tries to understand Wittgenstein's concept of FOL.

There are objective reasons why any discussion of Wittgenstein's concept of FOL is extremely hard. I will consider a few. There are only half a dozen mentions of the expression FOL in Wittgenstein's published works. His manuscripts and typescripts, which, although of help on other issues, don't seem much help on this one (Floyd makes this point in her contribution). There is a confusing use of singular (FOL) and plural (FOLs) that raises some arguments for and against the previously mentioned FOL accounts. There are quite different contexts in which FOL is mentioned. These and other arguments are recognized by all the contributors and are dealt with in an appropriate manner. In the light of these limitations raised by the book's topic, and in the light of the importance of the logico-linguistic account of FOLs, this collection is very good and on some points excellent.

In the introduction Martin explicitly identifies the FOL account that the book promotes, namely "a broadly logico-linguistic understanding" against both "biological" and "ethnological" (cultural) accounts (1). A kind of reduction of the many different accounts follows from this claim. Before, we mentioned five of them, but these five have various combinations. Compare Martin's understanding with the previously mentioned account-differentiation, as shown in the table below.                 

FOL accounts

Cultural / anthropological

Social / way of life



Organic / biological


Possible reduction

Possible similarity

Possible reduction

Ethnological / cultural



According to the table, one possibility is that the book tends to see only three out of the five mentioned FOL accounts as relevant nowadays, i.e., cultural, biological and logico-linguistic. If this is the case, it raises the question of the reduction of the social to cultural and of the behavioral to biological account. These are currently, perhaps, the most common accounts. However, one should bear in mind that they basically rest on interpretations of Wittgenstein's concepts and their reductions, namely on the reduction of social to cultural and of behavioral to biological, but this isn't an easy thing to do given that Wittgenstein describes these concepts in different ways. For the sake of argument let us suppose that this is the case. Even if this is so, we are still left with the broadly similar language-game and logico-linguistic accounts of FOL.

In the introduction, Martin stresses the difference between these two in such a way that the language-game account connects only language-games to FOLs, while his idea is to connect the logical to FOLs as well. This connection will be presented in his forthcoming monograph "Logical Form as Form of Life" (1, footnote 2). Based on this short footnote, one can only guess what this monograph will be about. Since the subtitle is about "Unity of Wittgenstein's Philosophy" it wouldn't be surprising if logic in Wittgenstein's later philosophy will be explicated as a part of philosophical grammar or the other way around. Nevertheless, it is only as an idea that this is an interesting possibility of interpretation, especially if one sees parallelism between some of Wittgenstein's earlier and later concepts such as fact-form of life/action, proposition-language-game, meaning-use, logic-grammar, application-practice, model-modeling, etc.

Let me now turn to some aspects of the collection. Given that the general direction of the book is sufficiently clear, even with the minor issues mentioned here, the essays in all three sections are individually and as a whole very good, and each points in the same direction of the logico-linguistic account of FOL (sometimes in ways that are not easy to reconcile). Given that a lot of argumentation for this account of FOL rests on the first section, which explicates paths to FOLs, the rest of this review will be mainly about a few points that directly deal with the issues mentioned previously.

Travis, in "The Rule of the Game (The Moment of Truth)", argues in principle for a Fregean reading of Wittgenstein's earlier and partly later concepts of "application". This idea is essentially acceptable since the influence of Frege on Wittgenstein can hardly be a wrong thing to emphasize. On one hand, what is interesting is that Travis tries to show that via TLP (1974) Frege continued to be among the major influences concerning issues at least from the beginning of PI (2009). This is open for discussion, however. On the other hand, his idea that "where a thought has a given application, such may be modeled in a game" (37), seems to be an excellent argument or at least the beginning of one.

There do seem to be at least some differences between Wittgenstein's earlier and later concepts of application. In so far as this is the case, the very concept of interpretation should be reinterpreted, or in fact was. Given that there is no interpretation without an application, there seems to be a huge difference between interpretation and application, for example, in the case of the "cube" in TLP (5.5423) and the "cube" in PPF (116, ex PI II). There seems to be a huge difference between a pre-conceptual model that needs to be applied (in order to be interpreted) and a post-conceptual model that is manifested by an activity of modeling.

Floyd ("Lebensformen: Living Logic") defends the position that the logic in Wittgenstein's later works is "a matter of living forms of our lives" (71). She builds her argument pointing out that while we can accept one concept of culture and reject another another during a single period of time, Wittgenstein accepted both concepts at some point of the development of his later philosophy. She raises the already mentioned issue of differentiating between Cavell's horizontal (ethnological) and vertical (biological) FOLs (Cavell 1989) and the issue of Wittgenstein distancing himself from Spengler's concept of Kultur (and for that matter from Goethe's concept of morphology as well; see Gustafsson's chapter, 173-92). Her chapter is an excellent example of showing what it means to evaluate influence on Wittgenstein:  to what extent he borrowed a concept and to what extent he changed it.

Concerning the horizontal/vertical FOLs distinction, on which at least a part of Floyd's argument rests, we can ask: what does it contribute to the understanding of Wittgenstein's concept of a FOL, except for combining two interpretations that have some grounds in texts? If we mix horizontal (ethnological, cultural) and vertical (biological, evolutionary, which is questionable concerning Wittgenstein's concept of evolution), we get a particular pattern. Say that we draw a Cartesian coordinate system with x and y axes, then we add some values and try to place Wittgenstein's uses of FOLs on the grid. We would get a pattern of his uses (we could add the z axes and perhaps see how the pattern changed over time), but the most important facts about this possible pattern would be hidden. Namely, that he used the concept of FOL and not any other, and that he applied it in a series of uses, but didn't in others.

Next we turn to Martin's "Duality, Force, Language-games and Our Form of Life" (113-52).  This article looks like the starting part of a longer research project (which he mentioned in his introduction). That project deals with the early ideas of "p" and "not p" as the beginning of the line of thought that, he argues, leads to the concept of FOL.

It is clear that any logico-linguistic account of FOLs needs to connect them strongly to language-games, to rules, perhaps to grammar, and finally to Wittgenstein's later conception of logic. The most obvious candidates for such a connection are elements of Wittgenstein's explicitly logical remarks starting from "Notes on Logic" to "On Certainty". Those elements show a kind of continuity of philosophy of logic or philosophical logic. In this sense, Martin's approach is justified and the argument makes sense.

Martin's complementary ideas that he obviously shares with Travis, Floyd, and in part with Kern (especially when he discusses FOLs having some kind of human "reality" in the Hegelian sense of the word) make the whole picture of the logico-linguistic account of FOL even more appealing. In other words, many non-language-game accounts of FOL tend to forget its obvious connection to language. Leaving language and moving toward, say, action isn't movement beyond language, but staying within language seen as an action among other actions within a FOL. Therefore, there is an obvious importance of the logico-linguistic account of FOL, if it tends to preserve this aspect of FOL.

However, if this account wants to go far beyond available textual evidence, no matter how unclear and how many alternations and repetitions it undergoes, it should in some way interpret the obvious lines such as those at the beginning of PI that say that an activity of speaking is "a part" of an activity of FOL (PI 23), and that on the level of imagination a language-game and a FOL are identical (PI 19). This element seems to be highlighted in Martin's analysis when he writes about "thinking-out as a living activity" (132-37), a line of argument that seems to be very important. On the other hand, how this helps the logico-linguistic account of FOL that tends to explicate FOL as a structural, epistemological, methodological and even heuristic device isn't clear (see Benoist, 155-71; Mühlhölzer, 193-218; and Baz, 253-75; passages on FOL and Hegel and Merleau-Ponty are quite important since the "continental" influence of Schopenhauer and Kierkegaard on Wittgenstein are often forgotten).

Perhaps there is the need to draw a line between the concept of "living" and "bare activity" (125) in a way similar to Wittgenstein drawing a line between living when he speaks of "us humans", and bare activity when he speaks of "habits" and "habitual actions". Nonetheless, these remarks go far beyond Martin's argument and it is unfair to pursue them. His contribution to the logico-linguistic account of FOL is quite clear in terms of explicating some features of early notions and their connection with the later ones in Wittgenstein's philosophy (this is, besides other arguments, sufficient for the claim of the unity of his philosophy which remains to be seen).

To conclude, anyone interested in interpretations of Wittgenstein's major philosophical concepts -- some of which (e.g., language-games and FOLs) thinkers were so taken with internationally they became standard philosophical and non-philosophical terms -- should recognize this collection as a valuable contribution to the ongoing debate on the interpretation of one of Wittgenstein's major philosophical concepts.

This is a book that promotes a particular account of FOL as one of the basic concepts of Wittgenstein's later philosophy -- which is sufficient reason for reading and discussing it. There is, though, another reason. This work, a collection of more or less differently focused chapters, promotes the same reading of FOL, one missing in other readings, especially, as Martin points out, biological and ethnological readings .

As such, this book perhaps will start a new debate and other readings will be offered in the future. Last but not least, this collection, as opposed to writings that promote other accounts of FOLs, rests on the new critical apparatus that researches not only Wittgenstein's published works, but also online available manuscripts and typescripts that are now being published more and more. In this way it is comparable to the 2015 special issue of Nordic Wittgenstein Review on FOLs. This point raises the issue of FOL exegetically speaking to the high level that should be accorded to Wittgenstein's philosophy.


Cavell, S. (1988) This New Yet Unapproachable America, Albuquerque, Living Batch Press.

Glock, H.-J. (1996) A Wittgenstein Dictionary, Oxford, Blackwell.

Glock, H.-J. and Hyman, J. (eds.) (2017) A Companion to Wittgenstein, Oxford, Wiley-Blackwell.

Krkač K., Lukin, J. (2007) Forms of life as forms of culture, in H. Hrachovec, A. Pichler, J. Wang (eds.) Philosophy and Information Society, ALWS, Kirchberg am Wechsel, 2007: 112-114.

Richter, D. (2004) Historical Dictionary of Wittgenstein's Philosophy, Lanham The Scarecrow Press, Inc.

Wittgenstein, L. (1961) Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, London, Routledge &Kegan Paul Ltd. (TLP).

Wittgenstein, L. (2009) Philosophical Investigations, Oxford, Wiley-Blackwell (PI).

1 For example, Glock 1996: 124-29, Richter 2004: 73-5, Glock and Hyman 2017: 69-72, 357-7 (especially  420-33 where D. Whiting combines "vertical" [biological] and "horizontal" [social] senses of FOL, which Cavell had introduced [1989] and are followed by Floyd in her contribution to the book under review [69-71]).