Language Lost and Found: On Iris Murdoch and the Limits of Philosophical Discourse

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Niklas Forsberg, Language Lost and Found: On Iris Murdoch and the Limits of Philosophical Discourse, Bloomsbury, 2013, 245pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781623564834.

Reviewed by Bridget Clarke, University of Montana


It is clear how people who have been dispossessed of their cultures -- exiles, refugees, or members of a conquered nation, for instance -- might suffer from a loss of concepts that makes it hard or impossible for them to make sense of their lives and their world.[1] But what about those of us who are more fortunate, whose cultures are seemingly intact? Is conceptual loss a problem we face? What would that mean, and what is there to be done about it? These are Niklas Forsberg’s questions.

In addressing them, Forsberg takes Iris Murdoch as his “primary discussion partner” (1), yet it is Stanley Cavell’s ordinary language philosophy that provides the book’s philosophical vision. The work proceeds less as an argument than as an elaboration of a family of ideas: that conceptual loss may result not only from large-scale cultural disruptions but also from a misfit between the way an individual leads her life and the words or concepts she uses; that one who suffers from conceptual loss may not realize it; that a great many and perhaps all of us in the West do so suffer; that established ways of doing philosophy both generate conceptual loss and help to blind us to it; that works of philosophy can also serve as mirrors that reveal to those who suffer from conceptual loss the truth about their condition; that literature can do the same and that this is a prime source of its philosophical significance; that the remedy for conceptual loss often involves rediscovering and renewing ordinary language; that Iris Murdoch’s novels and philosophy are best understood in these terms -- as attempts to alert us to our impoverished conceptual condition and to lead words back to their everyday use.

Why Murdoch? She saw us as suffering “a general loss of concepts, the loss of a moral and political vocabulary” that would enable us to see ourselves in connection to values and realities that transcend us.[2] Murdoch connected this loss to the diminished status of religion and the ascendance of science in the modern period. And in addition to being a significant philosopher and cultural critic, she was one of the major novelists of the second half of the twentieth-century. She is very well-suited to Forsberg’s project. For this reason, and as a distant admirer of Cavell, I was excited to see where it would lead. My feeling, however, is that Murdoch ends up serving more as a mouthpiece for ordinary language philosophy than as a conversation partner, and this keeps the book from making a strong contribution to our thinking about Murdoch or about conceptual loss.

Chapters 1-3 develop the interpretation of Murdoch’s philosophy and set the stage for an interpretation of Murdoch’s novel The Black Prince in chapter 4. Selective and somewhat disputable readings of Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein supply the concepts of mirroring and indirect communication Forsberg uses to interpret Murdoch. Chapter 5 extends the themes of these chapters through a discussion of Cora Diamond’s reading of J. M. Coetzee’s Elizabeth Costello. The sixth and concluding chapter consolidates the proposed picture of how we must conceive, or reconceive, philosophy and literature if they are to help us reconnect to our language and achieve a more adequate self-understanding.

In developing his picture of Murdoch as an ordinary language philosopher, Forsberg places considerable weight on her assertion that

There is a two-way movement in philosophy, a movement toward the building of elaborate theories, and a move back again towards the consideration of simple and obvious facts. McTaggart says that time is unreal, Moore replies that he has just had his breakfast. Both these aspects of philosophy are necessary to it.[3]

His gloss on it is that the impulse to do philosophy properly issues in a return to ordinary -- but creatively renewed -- language. In his words:

When I find myself lost in our world, philosophy calls upon me to act and think. The words that everyone around us seems to employ without worry or hesitation are lost on me; they no longer seem to carry their weight for me. So I start to think. I theorize . . . But the only way that true peace of mind can be conquered is to make myself able to see that I share my world with those others whose words I had just repudiated. . . . we are instructed to see that the emergence of a philosophical problem often has its root in a pressing feeling that a mapping of theoretic ideality is necessary and the only way out is often a regained and reclaimed community (10).

Perhaps, but it looks rather as if Murdoch simply wishes to say that philosophy is a source of illumination necessarily distinct from ordinary reflection, but not too distinct. As she puts it elsewhere:

Philosophy is perpetually in tension between empiricism and metaphysics, between, one might say, Moore and McTaggart. . . . There are times for piecemeal analysis, modesty and commonsense, and other times for ambitious synthesis and the aspiring and edifying charm of lofty and intricate structures.[4]

This fits with the fact that she devotes her final philosophical work to showing that ‘metaphysics’ is indispensable to moral life; it also fits with what she has to say about the role of ordinary language in doing metaphysics. For Murdoch, metaphysics is a ‘one-making’ endeavor. It seeks to unify our beliefs and perceptions, show how they all hang together. She considers it necessary to preserving the idea that reality transcends our best understandings of it, and dangerous because it often leads to great oversimplifications, especially concerning our relations with one another. When considering how to use the idea of unity productively in moral philosophy, she notes that while we might do well to reflect upon a situation involving the virtues as we would ordinarily use these terms, “It is useless to ask ‘ordinary language’ for a judgment, since we are dealing with concepts which are not on display in ordinary language or unambiguously tied up to ordinary words. Ordinary language is not a philosopher.”[5]

Forsberg’s preferred reading of the ‘two-way movement’ reappears in the discussion of Murdoch’s perfectionism. He notes that, for Murdoch, the work of ‘attention’ whereby we improve the fitness of our perceptions is something that goes on (or fails to) continuously (145). This much is uncontroversial. He continues:

But it is something which we can block, deny or reject. One may indeed say that philosophy often (but probably not always) begins in such deflections; that philosophical problems, in a sense, are such blockings. We may say that in cases where interminable messiness is ‘solved’ by the human will to one-making, we can often see the movement of philosophy as a form of deflection from the ordinary, a shared community. Thus, we need to find ways to get back home (granted that we know we are away, drifting) -- a need to be reminded about, and perhaps jolted back into, the world which is ours (145).

It’s not clear that he’s exactly attributing this thought about deflection to Murdoch, but that is part of the problem: it’s not clear. The lines between what Murdoch thinks and what Cavell or Forsberg thinks are strangely porous.

Forsberg’s association of the two-way movement Murdoch sees in philosophy with a return to ordinary language facilitates his claim that Murdoch does not herself offer us a positive theory in her philosophical works. She can’t, in his view, because she, too, suffers from the conceptual loss to which she wishes to alert us. “Murdoch herself does not know the language she wants us [sic] [to] teach us” (61). Accordingly, “what oftentimes is taken to be her positive contributions to philosophy should rather be seen as a form of negative or destructive philosophy, aiming to make us aware that the sense that we do think we find in her words may be idling” (16). As Forsberg sees it, she is not offering an alternative to the going theories of morality but trying to uncover an understanding of our words that philosophizing tends to cut us off from (59).

This is a striking claim to make about Murdoch, particularly given that she elaborates a distinctive philosophical vision in the essays that form The Sovereignty of Good and again in Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals. That vision is centered around a transcendent idea of ‘Good’ and takes the activity of ‘attention,’ which she derives from Simone Weil, to be the mark of the moral agent. These works record Murdoch’s attempt to supply us with a secular morality that nonetheless connects us to something transcendent and in this way keeps the tremendous difficulties of the moral life in view. And while she makes clear that what she means by transcendent has nothing to do with “some metaphysically cut off never never land” it is far from obvious that we should think of it as somehow implicit, waiting to be found, in our ordinary understandings.[6] She asks not just what we have lost by way of concepts, but also what we have perhaps never had.[7] And she describes the greatest of philosophers as supplying us with new concepts with which to interpret the world.[8] None of this constitutes a decisive case against Forsberg; the problem is that he doesn’t acknowledge the scope of the difficulties his bold and interesting reading of Murdoch faces. It does not help to note, as he does at one point, that Murdoch may at times “unknowingly” be engaging in the project he attributes to her (112).

There is similar interpretive overreach in his reading of The Black Prince in his pivotal chapter. He makes the claim that the philosophical significance of the novel is less to be found in the philosophical-sounding utterances of its characters per se than in the way that the novel allows us to see how a character’s words may be disconnected from the life he leads. By implication, we should not think of Murdoch as using the main character, Bradley Pearson, to voice her own philosophical views. Forsberg goes on to develop these appealing claims with an extraordinarily labored idea of how the novel is supposed to work as a mirror in which to seduce the reader into seeing her own “conceptual confusions.” This strategy leads him to posit all manner of didactic duplicity on Murdoch’s part, at one point suggesting that we are supposed to follow Pearson “through his downfall, and if we are to be inclined to follow him, we must think that the rungs of the ladders he attempts to climb carry his weight. We need to recognize ourselves in this mirror before we can see the value of this image (by renouncing it)” (166).

One need not be sympathetic to the readings of the novel Forsberg opposes in order to find this quite a stretch, particularly considering Murdoch’s professed “horror” of putting “philosophical ideas” into her novels, a point Forsberg wishes to take seriously.[9] Indeed, Murdoch doubts that “the deep structure of any good literary work could be a philosophical one.”[10] Such remarks make at least as much trouble for Forsberg’s interpretation of the novel as they make for interpretations that suppose that Pearson voices Murdoch’s own views directly. Forsberg’s concession that the concept of a mirror is not necessary to understanding Murdoch’s novels but merely helpful only makes it harder to understand his aim (77).

At its worst, Forsberg’s reading of Murdoch is cavalier and condescending to Murdoch herself. At its best, it gives us a way to think about her entire oeuvre that may prove fruitful. Either way, Forsberg’s quickness to align Murdoch’s view with (something like) Cavell’s means that his Murdoch is unable to enliven the picture of conceptual loss he offers.

On that picture, conceptual loss is rooted in a simpleminded conception of language and of self that takes the meaning of words to be fixed once and for all. One who is in the grip of the simpleminded conception will not see “just how differently the same words may be used depending upon who we are, what we see and where we picture ourselves as going” (171). Such a person will think he knows what his words mean when he doesn’t. In essence, such a person is in denial about the fact that our lives change, and that what we can mean with our words changes with them. Forsberg gives the example of ‘research.’ As he explains it, the term properly involves the idea of ‘not knowing,’ of exploration with uncertain dividends. But we now live in a time when we must justify our research by pointing to its usefulness, even though a part of what it is to do research necessarily involves not knowing whether and in what way it will turn out to be useful. We end up confused about the point of the work we do because we do not appreciate the conceptual shift that has taken place; we do not appreciate that research is and isn’t what it used to be (133-134).

But do many people take language to be frozen in this way? And is this really the problem with a character such as Pearson? I agree with Forsberg that Pearson is not an example of a person who is morally progressing in Murdoch’s terms, or probably anyone else’s, but it’s hard to believe that what is wrong with him -- callousness, for one -- has much to do with the fact that “he is not really open to conceptual change” (172). An engagement with Murdoch’s theory on its own terms might have given this view some ballast. One wonders, for instance, what such a denial of change might have to do with the egoism that Murdoch took to be the single greatest problem in the moral life. Or how her antidote to egoism, which turns on practices of ‘unselfing,’ relates to the “detailed examinations of how our concepts are turned” that Forsberg recommends (217). These are good questions, and Forsberg’s reading of Murdoch renders them all but invisible.

The work contains a great many typos and imprecise or awkward formulations that should have been caught by the editorial team. This is particularly unfortunate in a book that sees salvation in how we relate to our words.


Thanks to Paul Muench for improving earlier versions of this review.

[1] Jonathan Lear examines the case of the Crow people in Radical Hope: Ethics in the Face of Cultural Devastation (Harvard, 2006). Cora Diamond discusses different forms of conceptual loss with the help of many fine examples in “Losing Your Concepts,” Ethics 98 (1988): 255-277.

[2] “Against Dryness,” Existentialists and Mystics: Writings on Philosophy and Literature, ed. Peter Conradi (Allen Lane, The Penguin Press, 1998 [1961]), 290.

[3] “The Idea of Perfection,” The Sovereignty of Good (London and New York: Routledge, 2003 [1970]), 1.

[4] Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals (Allen Lane, The Penguin Press, 1992), 211.

[5] “The Idea of Perfection,” 55-56.

[6] “Literature and Philosophy: A Conversation with Bryan Magee,” in Existentialists and Mystics, 29.

[7] “Against Dryness,” 290.

[8] “Vision and Choice in Morality,” Existentialists and Mystics, 83.

[9] “Literature and Philosophy: An Interview with Bryan Magee,” 19.

[10] Ibid., 21, emphasis added. The remark in full is: “In general I am reluctant to say that the deep structure of any good literary work could be a philosophical one. I think this is not just a verbal point. The unconscious mind is not a philosopher. For better and worse art goes deeper than philosophy.”