Language, Meaning and Use in Indian Philosophy: An Introduction to Mukula's Fundamentals of the Communicative Function

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Malcolm Keating, Language, Meaning and Use in Indian Philosophy: An Introduction to Mukula's Fundamentals of the Communicative Function, Bloomsbury, 2019, 301pp., $88.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350060777.

Reviewed by Brendan S. Gillon, McGill University


If you are interested in the problem of how expressions in natural language are understood, and in particular, how expressions have an array of meanings, and you are curious about how such problems have been raised and addressed in an intellectual tradition outside of the Western tradition, then this is the book for you. At its core is a very readable translation of a key text in the Indian philosophical, linguistic and literary tradition, Fundamentals of the Communicative Function, by Mukula Bhaṭṭa (fl. 950 CE). But Keating's book is much more than a very lucid and readable translation of a Sanskrit text on the nature of linguistic meaning. It provides all the philosophical, linguistic and literary background required to read the translated text easily. The book is entirely self-contained. It can be read with profit by a casual, philosophically informed reader, be he or she a student or a scholar, or by a contemporary specialist in the philosophy of language, or by a student of Indology eager to expand his or her knowledge of the classical Indian philosophical tradition. In short, it is a wonderful piece of scholarship which will serve anyone with non-parochial philosophical and linguistic and literary interests.

The book has six parts: an introduction (Part I), the translation of Mukula's Fundamentals of the Communicative Function (Part II), a running explanation of the translated text, which can be read with the translation or separately (Part III), an edition of the text in standard Roman transliteration (Part IV), a general discussion of how the main ideas of the text relate to contemporary debates in which philosophers and linguists engage pertaining to the nature of meaning (Part V) and three supplements comprising a glossary, a guide to Sanskrit pronunciation, a chronology of important people and dates and indices of passages cited by Mukula in his work (Part VI).

Four chapters make up Part I. 'Why did Mukula Bhaṭṭa write the Fundamentals', sets out the text's general questions ; 'Indication and Resolving Incongruity: Mukula's Response' sums up Mukula's response to the questions set out in the preceding chapter; 'Understanding Mukula's Context' provides the general intellectual setting required for following the details of what Mukula wrote; and 'Further Reading by Topic' informs readers of what they can read to appreciate better what is explained in the preceding chapter. The recommended reading is apposite and up to date.

The translation of Mukula's text is accurate and easily read. It is followed by two appendices: one which outlines the text, using Tractatus-style numbering and references to corresponding parts of the text; the other gives a list of the examples used by Mukula as well as references to where they occur in the text. Keating's expository recapitulation of the text, which he calls a commentary, can be read, as stated above, either with Mukula's text or independently. Keating wisely separates his recapitulation of Muluka's text from his exposition of how the ideas in the Mukula's text pertain to contemporary philosophical and linguistic discussions which seek to distinguish the pragmatic and the semantic aspects of meaning. Carefully avoiding superficial identifications of ideas found in Mukula's work with those found in the contemporary discussions of roughly the same topic, Keating nonetheless draws nuanced comparisons, which help the reader to better appreciate what Mukula has said and to see in a somewhat different light the contemporary ideas.

Mukula's work comprises 15 verses and his commentary on those verses. As Keating explains, this form of presentation is commonly found in the intellectual tradition of classical India, the verses permitting the author to formulate his key ideas succinctly, and therefore easily committed to memory, and the commentary permitting him to expatiate on and to defend his key ideas.

Let me now turn to the central question of the Sanskrit work. That central question presupposes five assumptions, to some extent explicitly acknowledged in the classical Indian intellectual tradition. The first is that the unbounded set of expressions comprising a language results from the application of a finite set of finitely specifiable rules to a finite set of basic expressions. This idea is implicit in the world's first informal, generative grammar, a grammar of Sanskrit, entitled the Eight Chapters (Aṣṭādhyāyī), attributed to Pāṇini (5th century BCE). The same idea is explicit in the Great Commentary (Mahābhāṣya), written by Patañjali (2nd century BCE). (The relevant passage is translated and discussed by J. F. Staal in his 'Sanskrit philosophy of language', which appears in Linguistics in South Asia, v. 5, pp. 501-502.)

The second idea is that humans understand a complex expression through an understanding of its constituent subexpressions. This idea received empirical support from the simple observation made by numerous classical Indian grammarians that two complex expressions, in particular two sentences, which differ from each other only by one word can thereby differ from each other with respect to success conditions. To recast the difference in contemporary terms, they differ with respect to truth conditions, one sentence being true, the other, differing by one word, is false.

The third idea, implicit in the classical Indian grammatical tradition, is that the way in which simpler expressions are put together to form more complex expressions plays a role in how one's understanding of a complex expression arises from one's understanding of constituent subexpressions making it up.

The fourth idea is that some aspect of the understanding of an expression remains invariant over its different uses, what we can call an expression's literal meaning. For should any expression have no invariant understanding associated with it from occasion of use to occasion of use, no one could understand it at all. However, to say that some aspect of the understanding of an expression remains invariant from occasion of use to occasion of use does not mean that other aspects of its understanding cannot be modulated by interlocutors' understanding of the context in which it is used. This variation can be required by special words, known as demonstratives, or it can arise from beliefs shared by the interlocutors.

The fifth idea, most directly relevant to the text, is that expressions convey a primary, or literal, meaning and may, in addition, convey a secondary meaning, distinct from the primary meaning. In light of this, one wonders: What is the range of such conveyed meaning? And what are the principles which permit an interlocutor to go from the literal meaning to the conveyed, or secondary meaning?

Here are Mukula's three principles, as stated by Keating (p. 10):

Incongruity: There must be an incongruity in the primary meaning.

Relationship: There is a relationship between the primary and secondary meanings.

Motive: There must be some motive to understand the secondary meaning.

The basic question addressed is what the range of cases which fall under these principles is. One view is that only figurative usage falls under these principles, that is, cases involving metonymy, synecdoche, metaphor, etc. Here are two examples, cited in the classical Indian tradition, of sentences conveying a primary and a secondary meaning. Each is paired with an example found in contemporary English.

(1.1) The village is on the Ganges. (Sanskrit example)
         conveys: the village is on the bank of the Ganges.

(1.2) My cottage is on the lake. (Contemporary example)
        conveys: my cottage is near the shore of the lake.

(2.1) The cots are crying. (Sanskrit example)
         conveys: the children lying on the cots are crying.

(2.2) The stands went wild. (Contemporary example)
         conveys: the people in the stands went wild.

Authors such as Ānandavardhana (850 CE), a thinker who preceded Mukula, claimed that there are non-literal usages which are not figurative and fall outside of the purview of these principles. One example drawn from the classical literature is the sentence in (3) below. Unlike the examples in (1) and (2) above, where the literal meaning is understood to be inconsistent with common beliefs, the sentence in (3), when used by one person to convey to another an invitation to come to the first person's bed, does not involve a literal meaning which is inconsistent with common beliefs.

(3) You must not fall into my bed. (Sanskrit example)
      conveys: you are invited into my bed.

For anyone familiar with the contemporary literature on non-literal meaning and the principles governing the connection between literal and non-literal meaning knows, such questions are subtle and complicated. Reading about how these questions are addressed in classical India renders matters still more complicated if one wishes to reach those unfamiliar with the relevant tradition. Keating does an excellent job of making both the issues and their cultural setting clear and easy to follow.