Language, Reality, and Mind: A Defense of Everyday Thought

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Charles Crittenden, Language, Reality, and Mind: A Defense of Everyday Thought, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009, 234 + x pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230576940.

Reviewed by David Boersema, Pacific University



In the introduction to this book, the author claims that his goal is to “give a broad-scale defense of everyday thinking and show why this is called for in today’s philosophical climate” (p. 1). The philosophical climate he refers to is restricted to analytic philosophy during the past fifty years — indeed, much of the focus is on people and positions that were prominent between 1960-1990 — particularly with respect to issues in the philosophy of language and the philosophy of mind. The stated main foil and target of Crittenden’s concerns are “naturalism” (or “scientific naturalism”), which he states has come to dominate analytic philosophy.

The book consists of nine chapters, following a brief introduction. Chapter One (“A Transcendental Argument for Everyday Thought”) contains the author’s proposal that there are fundamental principles required for all human thought. Because these principles form the basis and justification for philosophical and scientific reasoning, they cannot be superceded by, rejected by, or contradicted by subsequent reasoning.

While Chapter One presents Crittenden’s transcendental manifesto, Chapter Two (“Beginning to Talk about the World: Philosophical Requirements, Empirical Facts, and Expanding the Basic Framework”) lays out some basic, very general facts of nature, especially as they relate to language acquisition and communicative capabilities. Basic human conceptual schemes hook up to medium-sized, commonly-experienced, persisting objects; all human thought is based on these facts and cannot negate them.

In Chapter Three (“Objects and Nature”), Crittenden takes on the ontological claims of Quine and Sellars, arguing that Quine is mistaken to believe that everyday common objects are merely useful posits and that Sellars is wrong to suggest that common-sense ontology (Sellars’ “manifest image”) can be replaced by a more sophisticated “scientific image” and ontology. Chapter Four (“Reference and Natural Kinds”) contains the author’s engagement with Kripke and (early) Putnam. Here the author argues against what he sees as their commitment to a conception of natural kinds that is based on microstructures and micro-properties, such as H2O for water or even XYZ for Twin Earth water. For Crittenden, it is not microstructures or micro-properties that constitute a natural kind, but rather commonly-experienced facts about objects. For instance, speaking of a lemon as a natural kind, he notes that

having the concept of a lemon is not just knowing the standard features of its type but also being able to locate it in the general system of kind-classifications that serve as basic identifications. One might know that normal lemons had a yellow peel and a tart taste, and such, but if one did not know that lemons were fruit (and not restaurant concoctions, for example) one would hardly have a reasonable grasp of what ‘lemon’ refers to (pp. 85-86).

Chapters Five through Eight focus on issues relating to the philosophy of mind. Chapter Five (“Having a Mental Life”) deals with the nature of mentality and its requirement of embodied subjects. Reasons, not causes, are the explanatory currency. Chapters Six, Seven, and Eight take on three naturalistic analyses of mentality. In Chapter Six (“Contemporary Theories of the Mental: Pains, Brains, and Consciousness”) the author offers rebuttals to identity theory and eliminative materialism. In Chapter Seven (“Thought: Computers and Varieties of Functionalism”) he challenges Fodor (among others), arguing that functionalism cannot account for our ability to think about objects that have not (cannot) influence us causally nor for objectless mental states, such as meditation. In Chapter Eight (“The Mental and the Physical”) he considers two “attempts to incorporate distinctively mental phenomena into naturalism”, namely, Nagel’s what it’s like to be a bat and Chalmers’ hard problem of consciousness. Finally in Chapter Nine (“Overviews, Overbeliefs, and a Final Survey”) Crittenden considers the broad notions of objective and subjective standpoints, concluding that everyday concepts are compatible with various frameworks, but cannot be eroded by them, as these concepts form the underpinning of those frameworks.

Given Crittenden’s position and arguments, a number of questions arise. A major concern is the relation between his notion of transcendentalism (or, a transcendental argument) and naturalism. This concern plays out in various ways. First, what exactly is his conception of the transcendental? Something is transcendental in the sense of (because?) it transcends something else. By its very nature, then, transcendence is relational. Space and time, we might say, are transcendent of perceptual knowledge, since (the argument goes) space and time are necessary conditions for perceptual knowledge to be possible. But, surely, being a necessary condition is not itself a sufficient condition for something to be transcendental. (I assume that being unmarried is not transcendental with respect to being a bachelor.) What kind of necessity, then, is transcendence? Perhaps it is a foundation or perhaps it is a starting-point for inquiry. The author states, “Transcendental arguments are intended to show that certain assumptions are necessarily made if there is to be any complex thought whatsoever” (p. 9). If this means that we have to start somewhere, or, we need some sort of axioms or definitions just to get going, it is difficult to know what wouldn’t be a transcendental position. My point is simply that it would help to have a fuller sense of what is meant as a transcendental argument and what is ruled out (or in) with such an argument.

Nonetheless, Crittenden identifies nine conditions for his transcendental defense of everyday thought. These are: (1) there are conceptual frameworks; (2) a conceptual scheme allows the formulation of statements about some subject matter; (3) statements can have truth-value; (4) a framework includes ways of ascertaining when at least some of its assertions are actually true; (5) at least some of the objects of a framework — that is, some of the objects that are the subject matter of the statements of (4) — are classified by the framework as really existing things that have at least some of the properties independently of procedures used to determine the truth values of these statements; (6) some objects (that is, some of those that are the subject matter of a framework) are subject to investigation through the pursuit of non-arbitrary techniques; (7) there is at least one intelligent being capable of employing a conceptual framework; (8) some things — some of the objects constituting the subject matter of a framework — are available to the investigation of other intelligent individuals; and (9) the possession of language requires membership in a community of speakers. I take it that these boil down to: we exist in a ready-made world that we bump into; we say (and think) things about that world and some of what we say (and think) is true (i.e., corresponds?); in order to say (and think) things about the world, we need language (and attendant conceptual schemes), which itself is social (as opposed to individualistic) in nature. Frankly, I find it difficult to disagree with these claims and I suspect that most, if not all, philosophical naturalists would as well. John Dewey comes immediately to mind. (Of course, as the author points out in his various chapters, some philosophers do disagree with one or other of these conditions, or claims.) Indeed, many of the author’s basic claims and arguments are ones that have been championed by so-called naturalists. For instance, Dewey and George Herbert Mead (along with many others) argued that gestured communication led to language and conceptualizations and classificatory schemes — a point that Crittenden takes to be fundamental to his transcendental position. Or: when philosophical naturalists claim that the content and the standards of evaluation of moral claims are the result of, and are a function of, human interaction with their various environments, it is not clear how this is contrary to the author’s contentions of the content or normative force of his nine conditions, so, again, it is not apparent how they are transcendental.

The rub, then, is whether these conditions themselves are either necessarily true — as opposed to being false or only contingently true — or, for that matter, necessary for inquiry to proceed. Defending everyday thinking and taking it as a starting-point for inquiry is one thing, but claiming that it is a necessary and nonfalsifiable condition for any (further) inquiry is quite another. We know plenty of cases in which everyday thinking is mistaken. Common-sense tells us that the Earth does not move; common-sense classifies whales as fish; common-sense is mistaken about fundamental properties of space and time. As well, there are plenty of cases in which everyday thinking has nothing to say. Common-sense does not tell us that light is electromagnetic radiation or that it has finite velocity; common-sense does not tell us about quantum indeterminacy; common-sense does not tell us about dark energy or dark matter. Now, Crittenden is well aware that scientific investigations have revealed facts about the world that extend beyond what common-sense tells us, but he insists that they cannot contradict what common-sense tells us. But I do not see that he has made the case for this claim.

Crittenden offers a garden metaphor in which his nine transcendental conditions are the soil in which scientific plants are embedded and from which they derive their nourishment and sustenance. As such, these plants not only grew from this soil but also would wither outside it. (Even if water is H2O, it is still water and it is the water that we encounter everyday.) However, I have another concern about everyday thinking as a necessary condition for thought and inquiry: I believe the author is conflating the source of something with the justification for something. This is not simply a re-hashing of the context of discovery vs. context of justification issue (although it is related). Rather, given that there are clear and obvious cases in which the source of a belief or practice is quite separate from the justification for that belief or practice, Crittenden bears the onus to explain why his source of thought (the nine conditions above) justifies the conclusions he draws and does so necessarily. More importantly, it is not clear why the source of a belief or practice cannot be superceded or contradicted by future belief or practice that emerges from it.

Crittenden’s transcendentalism, then, I take it, is not that everyday thinking trumps science or dismisses science (even when the results of science are contrary to common-sense). Nor, I venture, is it really opposed to naturalism in the sense that many philosophical naturalists would promote. Rather, he seems to be arguing against scientism — the view that the results of scientific inquiry trump common-sense (especially a view committed to scientific reductionism, with physics ultimately providing the one and only correct account of the world). For example:

If the sciences, including physical science, are not independent but assume the conceptual base represented by everyday thought, this must seriously limit the claims of empirical science to answer, or to provide the chief materials for answering, philosophical questions in metaphysics, epistemology, and philosophy of mind. Answers to these questions are not to be found simply by naturalizing philosophy (p. 76).

I am actually fairly sympathetic to these concerns, although perhaps not for the same reasons as the author. The history of philosophy (and of human inquiry generally) is replete with claims that the latest scientific metaphors finally explain, or at least provide the best avenue for explanation of, the objects, events, processes, properties, and relations of the world, only to have these metaphors replaced (even contradicted) by others in future generations. This is as it should be; the more we learn about the world, or the more ways we approach and understand it, the more we attempt to provide coherent accounts and explanations. I certainly share Crittenden’s wariness regarding scientism, but it would have been helpful to have had a fuller understanding of what scientism (or naturalism) is for him. There appear to be a collection of assumptions or commitments that could have better been untangled: what scientism (or naturalism) is committed to, whether (and, if so, why) there is a commitment to either ontological or epistemic reductionism, whether scientism or even Crittenden’s transcendentalism is committed to a single, correct description of the world, etc.

Two final, small quibbles. The first is that some readers might find much of the discussion to be a generation old. Most, although not all, of the engagement is with writings from the mid-1960s to the mid-1990s. In itself this is not a problem (at least for this reviewer), but engaging with more recent advocates of naturalism might have strengthened the author’s claims. The second quibble is the author’s gesture toward the reasonable possibility of disembodied minds. The quibble is that his own words seem to undercut this gesture. After having suggested that there is the logical possibility of disembodied minds, he later remarks: “Subjects must have bodies capable of showing [psychological] states through speech, gesture, posture, facial expression, and behavior” (p. 151). He simply should have omitted his note on disembodiment at the end of end of Chapter Five.

Despite the various questions and concerns raised here, Crittenden’s book is well worth the read. He presents a series of strong arguments that challenge many of the mainstream stances of modern analytic philosophy. He forces a re-examination of what, exactly, philosophical naturalism is and what it is committed to and at the same time he forces us (yet again) to ask meta-philosophical questions about the content, methods, and norms of philosophy itself.