Language, Truth, and Literature: A Defense of Literary Humanism

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Richard Gaskin, Language, Truth, and Literature: A Defense of Literary Humanism, Oxford University Press, 2013, 376pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199657902.

Reviewed by Alan H. Goldman, College of William and Mary


This is a long and thematically rich book, with several different strands not always strongly interconnected. In one respect the lack of close connections is all to the good, since the more outlandish positions do not negatively impact the main, entirely plausible thesis of the book. On the other hand, that thesis, central to the humanistic view of literature that Richard Gaskin favors, is not as well and tightly defended as it might be. The main thesis is that many fictional literary works refer to the real world in ways that allow us to learn important truths from them, and that this cognitive value is also part of the literary or aesthetic value of those works. A second almost equally central thesis is that literary works have an objective meaning established at the time of their creation, and that critics or interpreters seek to reveal that meaning. In defending these claims Gaskin argues forcefully against reader response theorists, deconstructionists, the politicization of literary criticism, and skeptics in the analytic tradition regarding the cognitive value of literature.

The main part of the book begins with some spooky idealist metaphysics, albeit linguistic idealism developed also in an earlier book. According to this position, propositions as the referents of sentences are the primary constituents of the world. The "world is a product of language. . . . essentially propositionally structured . . . essentially the referent of language." (7) Objects and properties exist in the world only derivatively as theoretically posited elements in linguistically structured propositions. The "world is the transcendental creation of language.  . . . composed of entities which are in some sense meanings." (13-14) The world is constituted by our linguistic practices: the "ordinary world of objects and properties is not external to language." (292)

Gaskin argues in common sense terms against even loonier claims of deconstructionists, for example that the world is a text. He points out that we don't read the world, that it is not a type, as texts are, etc. But one can point out against him in a similar vein that tables and chairs and lions and humans are not theoretical posits, propositions, meanings, or elements of propositions, unless propositions are composed of such ordinary concrete things instead of the reverse, which is what Gaskin seems to intend. To the obvious objection that the world existed before language, he answers that this is true only in the sense that the world was then possibly expressible. He argues that to get beyond language we would have to get to the mythical Kantian thing-in-itself, which is impossible. In reply, short of that, there is the world as we perceive and experience it nonlinguistically. For him there is nothing beyond language, but clearly there is. Perhaps that is too brief a reply, but such rejoinders seem to me appropriate against such claims. One might also point out, if necessary, that if the thesis were true, apes and dogs could not share our world, but clearly they do. In a more ad hominem vein, the thesis of linguistic idealism could never occur to those whose work is less obsessed with language than the literary critic or analytic philosopher.

Fortunately, as noted and recognized by Gaskin, this metaphysical position, while argued for at length in the book, neither implies nor is implied by what I am viewing as its main theses. Its only connection with those theses regarding literature is Gaskin's adoption of the Fregean terminology of sense and reference to replace the more common distinction between form and content in literary works. Frege applied his distinction to sentences and terms, while Gaskin applies it to whole literary works. The substitution of the Fregean terminology is not entirely without consequence, as it leads Gaskin to claim that form cannot match or fail to match content: either a text succeeds in referring through its sense or it fails to refer. There is no privileged sense by which to pick out a given referent. But in fact the match of form to content or lack of it in artworks is commonly considered an aesthetic virtue or vice. Gaskin disputes this aesthetic criterion by example also. He cites the "ravishing" music in the harrowing finale of Poulenc's Dialogues of the Carmelites (316), an apparent misfit (why, if he is correct?) of which he approves. I approve of that music too, but would describe it as harrowing. And examples of proper criticism along these lines abound: Rossini's style is perfect for his comic operas, less successful even though modified for his tragedies. There is no other way to describe such examples except in terms of the perfect or less than perfect match between form and content.

Despite these criticisms, Gaskin's main thesis is in my view entirely correct and described almost entirely correctly by him, although not supported by the most relevant and accessible examples. Fictional literature can convey important truths, as he centrally maintains. Its literal explicit truths are typically prefaced by the implied operator "It is fictionally true that," made true by the performative utterances or inscriptions of authors. Sometimes these fictionally true sentences refer to real people and often to real places, which referents readers must grasp to fully understand the sentences. Then too, readers fill out the fictional worlds of literary works with features of the real world implicitly contained in the fictional worlds as well. But more important in terms of cognitive value is the fact that authors, in creating fictional worlds, use general terms that refer to properties instantiated also in the real world. In doing so they convey truths of a general nature.

Features of fictional characters resemble those of real people, and so we can learn how real people would behave in circumstances similar to those in fictional stories. When stories unfold with a probability approaching necessity, as Aristotle described the structures of good plots, when universals in fictions combine as they would in the real world, the stories imply general statements about the real world. In that way we learn general truths well worth knowing. Gaskin rightly sees knowledge acquired in this way as a kind of knowledge derived from testimony, tested by evidence of the reliability of the author and, more importantly, in terms of coherence with what we already know. He is also right that the way a literary work says what it says, its form or sense in his terms, can have cognitive value too, even if what it says is not new, and even if modern critics have focused too much on form and not enough on content. This value consists not just in learning new ways of saying things, but in relearning and deepening our knowledge in ways that can affect its practical payoff.

Curiously, Gaskin vigorously denies what others see as the main type of practical knowledge acquired in reading fiction: learning what it is like to experience various situations and relationships. He argues that reading indoors so as to experience various events in a novel is very different from experiencing similar events in real life. True, but so is sitting in a movie theater, and yet in both fictional cases we can empathize with characters and hence experience vicariously what they do. He argues further that imagining that one is witnessing the events in a fictional work would cause one to miss the literary nature or form of the work. Again, that may be true in the moment, but one can and typically does shift one's attention as one is reading so as to take in multiple aspects of fictional works. And in the case of reading novels, we can vicariously live through the types of experiences from which we learn much in real life about personal relationships, for example, so that these insights, even if once more not entirely new, press upon us more vividly.

According to Gaskin, one can state the referential content of a literary work in a paraphrase. In fact, understanding the content of a literary work depends only on being able to provide or recognize an adequate paraphrase. He attacks the banal one sentence paraphrases or statements of themes and theses of canonical novels by skeptics who doubt their cognitive value. But in these cases he offers little of greater length and more substance, even if what he substitutes is somewhat less banal. More substantial analyses of themes and theses in novels would reveal how much more we can learn from them: how personal relationships develop and deteriorate, how moral agency develops and disintegrates under social pressure, how to think about complex moral issues. None of this is subject to one or two sentence paraphrases. When he does offer longer analyses, for example of Shakespeare's Othello, he focuses, as is typical in modern criticism, on the way content is presented, on form or sense, in order to illustrate how critics can speak of form without being able to paraphrase. By contrast, in one sense he attributes more value to a paraphrase of content than I would, in that he thinks that the paraphrase itself, in capturing a major part of the cognitive value of a work, itself has aesthetic value, whereas I would say that in isolating the purely cognitive element, a paraphrase leaves out the other dimensions of engagement essential to grasping aesthetic value.

Gaskin's real forte lies not in supporting his central thesis with detailed paraphrases of thematic content from novels, but in his impressive knowledge of both ancient and modern poetry. His analyses of segments from a variety of poems strike me as consistently more plausible than the opposing interpretations he cites. He shows in many cases how the literary and historical context favors one meaning over others advanced by rival critics. These explications of obscure meanings lead to his second thesis, that works have unique objective meanings that interpreters or critics seek to reveal. I see two problems here. The first, an external and possibly irrelevant criticism, is that philosophers may not take great interest in these critical arguments or, on this side of the Atlantic, in such poets as Edward Thomas, a major focus of Gaskin's examples.

The second and far more important problem lies in the equation of meaning explication with interpretation, and in the move from the claim of objective meaning in a text to the claim that, with minor exceptions, there is a single right interpretation for each literary work. In my view Gaskin is right that texts or works exist before being interpreted, that they constrain proper interpretations, and that the meanings of their sentences or phrases is settled by the language used at the time of their creation. But except in the case of somewhat difficult to decipher poetry, interpretation of literary works (e.g., novels) does not consist in explicating the meanings of words or sentences, but in explaining broad form and content in the form of implicit themes and theses. Gaskin's focus is not on such explanations of content: he uses 'interpretation' to refer to paraphrase, elucidation of sentence meanings, and critical analysis of sense (form). Explanation of text as implying certain themes is not paraphrase in the usual sense, although analyzing the meanings of segments of poems is. It is the latter focus and the fact that texts should have settled meanings that leads Gaskin to move too quickly from objective word or text meanings to single right interpretations.

In some places Gaskin makes statements that might call this move into question. He notes that a paraphrase of a work does not equate with paraphrases of its individual sentences. But he does not infer from this that objective meanings do not equate with single right or true interpretations. He also admits that some works admit of multiple interpretations or ties for best ones, but sees this as a rarity (but what then happens to truth in these cases?). But if literary works can embody different aesthetic values under different construals of their themes, then multiple interpretations are what we should expect, and certainly what we get from different critics. Gaskin argues further that when critics disagree, they assume that there is a correct or true interpretation, and that if some interpretations are wrong or false, some other must be true.

For him, the true interpretation is the one an ideal audience would endorse. He assumes that an ideal audience would converge on a single interpretation, but this is certainly not true of actual critics, no matter how closely they approach the ideal. He chides critics for thinking that they alone directly confront texts, while all others are blinded by interpretations, but it is equally naïve to assume that one's interpretation of a work is uniquely correct, while all others are wrong. Finally, some interpretations can be unacceptable without there being only one that is acceptable.

Of course these criticisms do not indicate simple mistakes on Gaskin's part. They reflect my views, and other philosophers of literature will agree with him. I have also so far mostly ignored his cogent criticisms of his opponents. Some of these are sitting ducks, and he lines them up nicely before easily shooting them down. He points out, for example, that Stanley Fish's appeal to the community of critics is not sufficiently realist in its failing to recognize that a community of critics could agree on an outlandish interpretation. (Could not the community of language users similarly fail to adequately describe some portion of the world?) Of those opposing positions that move about and are harder to target successfully (although Gaskin does), I will mention only intentionalism as a theory of interpretation. One might expect Gaskin to be sympathetic to a position that agrees in positing single right interpretations, but he is not. He renders this view redundant by attributing to authors broad intentions that their works mean what they do mean in the language of the time. Along similar lines one could also attribute to them the intention to have their works maximally appreciated. Gaskin also convincingly argues that hypothetical intentionalism, the theory that interpretations are constrained by intentions that an ideal audience would ascribe to authors, either collapses into actual intentionalism or becomes superfluous in other ways. His anti-intentionalism is perhaps more extreme than that of most critics of the position, as he holds that intentions are irrelevant even in ascribing literary allusions: according to him, authors can allude to works they have never heard of.

Space prevents discussion of many other topics addressed in this rich and varied work. Gaskin's characterization of the ontology of fictional discourse, for example, is succinct and plausible, if not entirely original. His preface even contains a trenchant attack on current trends in university administration, and it ends with an equally telling critique of the politicization of literary criticism. There is certainly enough here to appeal to anyone interested in the philosophy of literature.