Last Steps: Maurice Blanchot's Exilic Writings

Placeholder book cover

Christopher Fynsk, Last Steps: Maurice Blanchot's Exilic Writings, Fordham University Press, 2013, 301pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823251032.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame


The purpose of Christopher Fynsk's book is to extract from Maurice Blanchot's later writings -- principally Le pas au-delà (1973) -- something like a "non-violent" ethico-political philosophy (if "philosophy" is not too strong a word). The term "non-violent" here has different conceptual contexts. One can be traced back to Blanchot's critique of Hegel's dialectic of negation in his signature essay, "Littérature et la droit à la mort" (1949).[1] On Blanchot's reading -- shaped in good part by Alexandre Kojève's famous lectures on Hegel from the 1930s -- signification of every sort consists in the annihilation of the singularity of things and their subsumption into concepts. Language as an instrument of representation is an instrument of violence insofar as its purpose is logical mastery, the subjection of persons and things to conceptual control, their confinement within the world of the Spirit. To predicate something of something is a form of Aufhebung, as if overcoming an adversary, even if the antagonist is a mere anomaly that stands in the way of the mind's clarity. Blanchot's (perhaps impossible) aim is to develop a non-lethal conception of literature in which words no longer function in behalf of statements, descriptions, narrations, expressions, or any rule of identity. The ideal of literature, Blanchot says, is "to say nothing, to speak in order to say nothing" (The Work of Fire, p. 324). A late poem by Paul Celan comes to mind:


Ein Vau, pf. in der That,

schlägt, mps,

ein Sieben-Rad:





Blanchot, thinking of the poet Stéphane Mallarmé's typographical experiments in Un coup de dés (1897), figures the materiality of words this way:

A name ceases to be the ephemeral passing of nonexistence [a concept] and becomes a concrete ball, a solid mass of existence; language, abandoning the sense, the meaning which is all it wanted to be, tries to become senseless. Everything physical takes precedence: rhythm, weight, mass, shape, and then the paper on which one writes, the trail of ink, the book. (The Work of Fire, p. 327)

Blanchot's own peaceful recourse is through the fragment -- paratactic writing that juxtaposes words and phrases instead of integrating them according to Aristotelian rules. (Imagine a discourse made of detours, interruptions, incompletions . . . ) The fragment is an instance of speech that speaks the "unknown":

To speak the unknown, to receive it through speech while leaving it unknown, is precisely not to take hold of it, not to comprehend it; it is rather to refuse to identify it even by sight, that "objective" hold that seizes, albeit at a distance. To live with the unknown before one (which also means: to live before the unknown, and before oneself as unknown) is to enter into the responsibility of a speech that speaks without exercising any form of power; even the power that accrues to us when we look, since, in looking, we keep whatever and whomever stands before us within our horizon and within our circle of sight -- thus within the dimension of the visible-invisible.[3]

One might recall here the first part of Heidegger's essay on "The Origin of the Work of Art," with its admonition to allow things to be mere things, that is, singular and refractory to the grasp (Griff) of concepts (Begriffe).[4] If there is an ethico-political dimension to a "speech that speaks without exercising any form of power," it would be a theory of freedom -- freedom from rather than freedom of the logical or cognitive subject.[5]

Fynsk accordingly approaches Blanchot by way of Emmanuel Levinas's conception of the ethical as a mode of "sabbatical existence" (p. 17), which is a form of life that seeks to preserve the alterity of persons (and things) by subordinating cognition to an anarchic responsibility for the good of the other -- a responsibility that is on the hither side of legislation in behalf of right conduct and a good conscience.[6] Of course, given the nearly life-long exchanges and debates between Levinas and Blanchot, it is often difficult to read the one without seeing the influence of the other. "Sabbatical existence" derives from the Jewish Sabbath: it is a pause or break in the utilitarian life of production and return. But it is also coherent with Blanchot's conception of the temporality of waiting, affliction, dying -- and writing (l'écriture): the entretemps or interruption of discourse in which the fragment replaces the work. The "step/not" pun in Le pas au-delà captures something of this endless deferral, as does the event of an "infinite conversation" (to which Fynsk devotes an appropriately open-ended chapter [pp. 76-108]). Elsewhere Désœuvrement, "worklessness," is Blanchot's word for it (Infinite Conversation, p. 424). And this in turn is a line of thinking reflected in Levinas's distinction between le dire and le dit, Saying and the Said, where the one is (like Blanchot's "speaking the unknown") an address or response to another, in contrast to the predication that reduces the Other to the Same:

Saying is not a game. Antecedent [en deça] to the verbal signs it conjugates, to the linguistic systems and the semantic glimmerings, a foreword preceding languages, it is the proximity of the one to the other, the commitment of an approach, the one for the other, the very signifyingness [signifiance] of signification (Otherwise Than Being, p. 5).

An "infinite conversation" is not a hermeneutical dialogue that addresses a subject matter (die Sache); it is a what Blanchot calls "a relation of the third kind" -- "a relation with what is radically out of my reach" (Infinite Conversation, p. 69), that is, a relation with an other (Autrui) who "does not speak to me as a self," namely one that can be known and identified. (Anonymity and invisibility constitute Blanchot's ethos, his form of the good life.) Likewise for Levinas le dire is not saying something about something; it is, paradoxically, a language without words, an event in which a subject "enters into contact with a singularity, excluding identification in the ideal, excluding thematization and representation -- an absolute singularity, as such unrepresentable. This is the original language, the foundation of the other one," namely the one constituted by signs and predications.[7]

The last half of Fynsk's book is best described as a non-linear reading of Le pas au-delà (1973) in which he ruminates upon Blanchot's elusive fragments on writing, nonidentity, the anonymous, the fragmentary, the neuter, affliction, and (of course) dying, the event that -- as in Blanchot's late text, The Instant of My Death (1994) -- holds every arrival (death, the future) both in abeyance and, paradoxically, in mind. Fynsk prudently refrains from reducing any of these fragments to a theory of anything -- here he follows Blanchot's warning that "there is always a risk that reading, instead of animating the multiplicity of transversal routes, reconstitutes a new totality from them."[8] Not all readers will find Fynsk's dense prose rewarding, but the same complaint is commonly made against Blanchot's difficult texts.

Nevertheless, if one were to bring Blanchot's thinking around to an ethical outlook, one could do worse than reflect upon the variety of contexts in which the word discretion has a critical application -- the kind of discretion that we show a word (or whatever) when we enclose it in quotation marks, as if holding something back. Le pas au-delà, after all, is a text inscribed entirely within the space of qualification in which what is written is kept at an indefinite distance, neither here nor there (nomadic or, in Fynsk's word, "exilic"). For example, the interlocutors in the book's italicized fragments are nothing if not figures of infinite reserve (as against "The novelist [who] lifts up the rooftops and gives his characters over to a penetrating gaze" [Infinite Conversation, p. 29]):

♦ It was like an eternal subject of pleasantry, an innocent game: "You met them in the street?" -- "Not exactly in the street: near the river, looking at books, then leaving or losing themselves in the crowds." -- "That could not be but so; and, rather young, aren't they?" -- "Young?" One had to stop at this word which involved, demanded, and promised too much; he did not concede it willingly until he let himself go ahead and answer: "Yes, young, there was no other word; and yet, young without anything that makes their age a moment of themselves, or youth a characteristic of age; young, but as in another time, thus not so young, as if youth made them ancient or too new to be able to appear only young." -- "How you have observed them; did you have time? was it possible? is it possible?" -- "It was not, in fact, but neither was it possible to meet them." (The Step Not Beyond, p. 8)

Or, more succinctly:

Thank you for all these words that have not been spoken. (The Step Not Beyond, p. 100)

For Blanchot, discretion is the condition of every relation of the third kind -- especially (when thinking of ethics and politics) friendship and community. Regarding friendship:

We must give up trying to know those to whom we are linked by something essential; by this I mean we must greet them in the relation with the unknown in which they greet us as well, in our estrangement. Friendship, this relation without dependence, without episode, yet into which all of the simplicity of life enters, passes by way of the recognition of the common strangeness that does not allow us to speak of our friends but only speak to them, not to make them a topic of conversations (or essays), but the movement of understanding in which, speaking to us, they reserve, even on the most familiar terms, an infinite distance[9]

One can recognize here Levinas's distinction between le dire and le dit: we are close to our friends in a confidential relation of alterity that allows us to address them but not to expose them to view.

Fynsk meanwhile emphasizes Blanchot's concept of community (esp. pp. 146-60), which is distinctive for its freedom from any form of sovereignty, as in Georges Bataille's notion of theacephalic group, a "community of those who have no community" -- inevitably, as Blanchot notes, a community "of small numbers."[10] Numbers, one might add, that do not add up to a whole, or of many into one -- in other words, a non-communitarian community that is rather more like a movement than a body settled in place: literary communities, communities of dissidents and exiles, and gatherings like those of May 1968. Blanchot recalls particularly a procession that took place in remembrance of demonstrators killed years earlier during the Algerian Crisis:

I believe that a form of community happened then . . . , one of those moments when communism and community meet up and ignore that they have realized themselves by losing themselves immediately. It must not last, it must have no part in any kind of duration. That was understood on that exceptional day: nobody had to give the order to disband. Dispersal happened out of the same necessity that had gathered the innumerable. Separation was instantaneous, without any remainder, without any of those nostalgic sequels that alter the true demonstration by pretending to carry on as combat groups (Unavowable Community, p. 32).

Such a movement is non-dialectical: its aim is the refusal rather than acquisition of power -- dissidence, dispersal, désœuvrement ("It must not last, it must have no part in any kind of duration."). Imagine a gathering that, paradoxically, does not form a crowd (at least not of the sort that Elias Canetti had in mind in his Crowds and Power [1960]).[11]

The term "unavowable" (inavouable) is worth a moment's reflection. It is, among other things, a term of discretion that implies a clandestine or underground community, or a community of intimates -- for example, the "community of lovers" to which Blanchot devotes much of his attention in his "commentary" on Marguerite Duras's Maladie de la mort (1982), where love, like friendship, is a relation of the third kind (without bond or unity), as in the story of Tristan and Iseult, whose (impossible) desire for one another "is strangeness itself, having consideration neither for what they can do nor for what they want, but luring themselves into a strangeness where they become estranged from themselves, into an intimacy which also estranges them from each other" (Unavowable Community, p. 43).

Perhaps one could say that love, like friendship and community, survives chiefly in a state of suspension -- between no longer and not yet -- which is perhaps why Blanchot writes as if the imminence of death (dying) were companion to every relation (companion without companionship). So perhaps we should speak not of philosophy but of Blanchot's ethico-politicalparadox, where friendship and community are no longer "fraternal" relations of reciprocity or exchange but are free of any affiliation, identity, or possessions held in common, including that of life itself.[12] They are what Blanchot would call relations of "passivity" whose traits are "anonymity, loss of self; loss of all sovereignty but also of all subordination; utter uprootedness, exile, the impossibility of presence, dispersion (separation)."[13]

One could hardly be more discreet than that.


[1] “Literature and the Right to Death,” The Work of Fire, trans. Charlotte Mandel

 (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1995), pp. 300-44.

[2] Gesammelte Werke, 3 (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1983), p. 136.

[3] “René Char and the Thought of the Neutral,” The Infinite Conversation, trans. Susan Hanson (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1993), p. 302. See also “Speaking is Not Seeing,” esp. p. 28: “For sight, speech is war and madness.”

[4] See Poetry, Language, Thought, trans. Albert Hofstadter (New York: Harper & Row, 1971), esp. pp. 31-32: “The unpretentious thing evades thought most stubbornly. Or can it be that this self-refusal of the mere thing, this self-contained independence, belongs precisely to the nature of the thing? Must not this strange and uncommunicative feature of the nature of the thing become intimately familiar to thought that tries to think the thing? If so, then we should not force our way to its thingly character.”

[5] See Emmanuel Levinas, “Finite Freedom,” Otherwise Than Being, Or Beyond Essence, trans. Alphonso Lingis (The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1981), pp. 121-29. See also Fred Dallmayr, “Ontology of Freedom” Heidegger and Political Philosophy,” Polis and Praxis: Exercises in Contemporary Political Theory (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1984), pp. 104-32; Rainer Schürmann, Heidegger on Being and Acting: From Principle to Anarchy, trans. Christine Marie-Gros (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1987); and Gerald L. Bruns, “”Blanchot/Celan: Unterwegssein (On Poetry and Freedom),” Maurice Blanchot: The Refusal of Philosophy (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997), pp. 79-101.

[6] See William Large, Emmanuel Levinas and Maurice Blanchot: Ethics and the Ambiguity of Writing (Manchester: Clinamen Press, 2005); and Lars Iyer, Blanchot’s Vigilance: Literature, Phenomenology, and the Ethical (New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2005).

[7] “Language and Proximity,” Collected Philosophical Papers, trans. Alphonso Lingis (The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1987), p. 116. To which Levinas adds this interesting formulation: “The proximity of things is poetry” and “is inseparable from proximity par excellence, or the proximity of the neighbor” (pp. 118-19).

[8] The Step Not Beyond, trans. Lycette Nelson (Binghamton: SUNY Press, 1992), p. 51.

[9] “Friendship” (1971), Friendship, trans. Elizabeth Rottenberg (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997), p. 291. See Fynsk, pp. 198-204.

[10] The Unavowable Community (1983), trans. Pierre Joris (Barrytown, NY: Station Hill Press, 1988), p. 6. See Bataille, “Nietzschean Chronicle,” Visions of Excess: Selected Writings, 1927-1939, ed. Allan Stoekl (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1985), esp. pp. 207-10, and also Stoekl’s introduction, pp. xix-xx (on the Acéphale).

[11] Crowds and Power, trans. Carol Stewart (New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux, 1962), esp. 169-200 (“The Crowd in History”).

[12] See Jacques Derrida on the other friendship of asymmetry, where the absolute alterity or singularity of the friend supersedes any fraternal bond, The Politics of Friendship, trans. George Collins (London: Verso, 1997), pp. 271-306. See also Patrick ffrench, “Friendship, Asymmetry, Sacrifice: Bataille and Blanchot,” Parrhesia, 3 (2007): 32-42.

[13] Blanchot, The Writing of the Disaster, trans. Ann Smock (Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press, 1986), p. 18.