Late German Idealism: Trendelenburg and Lotze

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Frederick C. Beiser, Late German Idealism: Trendelenburg and Lotze, Oxford University Press, 2013, 333pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199682959.

Reviewed by Edward Kanterian, University of Kent


There is a widespread prejudice that studying the history of philosophy is not philosophy, or at any rate not serious philosophy. It should be left to intellectual historians and so-called continental philosophers, understood to be, at best, poets, and at worst, fuzzy and bad thinkers, who can afford to waste their time on antiquated, boring texts. Although offering the excuse to read less than one should, there are various problems with this view. There is the obvious point that studying past thinkers can allow us to tap into an immense pool of inspiring ideas and discover overlooked alternatives to our own conceptions. It can also help us become aware of fundamental presuppositions of our own thinking and indeed understand the root of misconceptions we still hold. In a time of increasing specialisation and navel-gazing, knowing our past is also crucial for assessing the significance and importance of contemporary developments. We should also not ignore the possibility that some concepts need to be studied in their diachronical development, because they are rooted in the dynamics of human society and reason, as this is arguably the case with essentially contested concepts like 'art' or 'sovereignty', or indeed 'philosophy' itself. Finally, analytic philosophy has developed its own history by now, and has been studied by some of its major representatives, if we think of Michael Dummett, Peter Hacker, Peter Hylton, Peter Simons, Scott Soames and others.

As we now investigate the roots of analytic philosophy, we move backwards in time, discovering that the 19th century, especially in Germany, witnessed a significant number of original thinkers beyond the usual suspects Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, Marx and Frege. At the same time, the study of Kant and post-Kantian philosophy has naturally extended forward, investigating the fate of German philosophy after the death of Hegel in 1831. Coming from either direction, we encounter two major philosophers, unjustly forgotten, Adolf Trendelenburg (1802-1872) and Hermann Lotze (1817-1881). Trendelenburg is maybe still known as the destroyer of Hegelianism and certainly as having posed a mighty challenge to Kant's transcendental idealism, based on the famous 'neglected alternative' objection. He also wrote an important essay on Leibniz's lingua characteristica, which employs the notion 'Begriffsschrift' and inspired the development of Frege's concept-script and early views of language, some of Frege's phrases sounding much like Trendelenburg's.[1] Although Lotze's views were well summarized in John Passmore's A Hundred Years of Philosophy, he is at most known today as an influence on Frege's (and Husserl's) anti-psychologism.[2] It is less known that both had some illustrious students, for example Dilthey, Frege, Brentano and Husserl. Frederick C. Beiser's latest book aims to rekindle interest in these two key figures mediating between German idealism and analytic philosophy, two currents widely considered to be antagonistic.

The book is divided into an introduction, a first part, on Trendelenburg, a second part, on Lotze, and an epilogue. The two thinkers are Beiser's focus not so much because they were part of the same school of thought or even engaged in the same debate. They never met and only exchanged a few letters. Still, according to Beiser they deserve joint treatment, because, contrary to what is sometimes assumed, they were the last great representatives of the German idealist tradition (discussed by the author in many previous books), their main ambition being to preserve its legacy and 'to sustain it in their more positivist, utilitarian, and materialistic age' (2). The metaphysical tenets of this tradition, following Beiser, were a holistic, teleological conception of the world as an organic whole, as opposed to a mechanistic worldview, and the idea that reality or nature conforms to or is an embodiment of the 'ideal'. Beiser demonstrates that both thinkers were also indebted to the Romantics. It will suffice to focus on Trendelenburg in what follows.

Beiser devotes six chapters to Trendelenburg, one concerning his place in history, another about his early years (1802-1840), three on his mature philosophy, and one concerning Trendelenburg's debate with Kuno Fischer about the neglected alternative objection. Trendelenburg is mostly known today, in Kant studies, for this debate, although it was only an episode in his career. He wrote major works in metaphysics, logic, ethics, political philosophy, aesthetics, philosophy of religion and pedagogy. Beiser provides very helpful and lucid summaries of these works, relating Trendelenburg's view to those of the tradition, and occasionally raising valuable critical points. He bases his discussion not only on readings of the original German texts, but also on secondary German literature, such as the intellectual biography Adolf Trendelenburg (1873) published by his pupil Ernst Bratuschek, or Klaus Christian Köhnke's magisterial history of early neo-Kantianism Entstehung und Aufstieg des Neukantianismus (1986), the latter being one of the few books in the field translated into English.[3]

Beiser describes Trendelenburg as a shrouded colossus, a major thinker and influential professor in Berlin for nearly 40 years, but forgotten soon after his death. Apart from his two main works, Logische Untersuchungen (Logical Investigations, 1840) and Naturrecht auf dem Grunde der Ethik (Natural Right on the Basis of Ethics, 1860), he published a great variety of other works, for example his dissertation on Plato, in which he attempted to demonstrate that Plato's theory of ideas constitutes the systematic unity and coherence of his dialogues, and a monumental history of the doctrines of categories from Plato to Hegel. He also wrote polemical essays against Hegel's logic, various articles on Aristotle, Spinoza, Leibniz, Kant, Johann Friedrich Herbart (another shrouded colossus of the 19thcentury), and on aesthetics, politics, pedagogy, and history. He was initially educated as a classicist, and Plato and Aristotle remained his reference points when he switched to philosophy.

In Logical Investigations Trendelenburg attempted nothing short of a renewal of philosophy. Dissatisfied with the speculative excesses of German idealism, but also the positivism of his day that made philosophy merely a servant of the sciences, he aimed for a middle ground, turning philosophy into a theory of science (Wissenschaftslehre), essentially a second-order discipline reflecting its most general, tacit presuppositions. As Bratuschek summarised Trendelenburg: 'Philosophy is the religion of the sciences: it has a purifying power, rising to the sempiternal'. This betrays an Aristotelian conception of philosophy, Beiser contends, since it aims to identify the general in the particular (the individual sciences), which will eventually help understand the particular in a better way. It also betrays a Platonic conception, since Trendelenburg takes all of our knowledge to form an organic, coherent whole, whose articulation is the task of metaphysics. We are, however, finite minds, and thus the 'whole of knowledge', the 'sempiternal', remains a regulative ideal, 'a system both necessary and impossible' (30), an unstable position already found in Romantics such as Friedrich Schlegel, who, Beiser suggests, influenced Trendelenburg. We may wonder, however, whether Trendelenburg's position can really work out. What exactly are the tacit presuppositions of, e.g., inorganic chemistry vs. those of political history? Would the former not still contain chemical concepts and the latter political concepts? In what sense can they then form an organic whole, i.e., what is the nature of their connection making them belong to the same whole? And how do we know that they belong to this whole, if the whole can never be reached? Finally, how can metaphysics express an organic, teleological view of the world, if a segment of it, the presuppositions of physics, contain mechanical and non-teleological concepts?

Beiser presents Trendelenburg's metaphysics in four steps, comprising the organic worldview, the metaphysics of motion, the defense of teleology, and the combination of idealism and realism. Beiser gives a helpful historical overview of the organic worldview from Plato to Schelling, which Trendelenburg, and Lotze, recast in modern terms. This view goes ultimately back to Plato's Timaeus, where the entire world is described as 'a single visible living being' (30d), entailing that matter is not an inert and purposeless 'fortuitous concourse of atoms' (as Jonathan Swift put it). It was re-adapted by Hegel, Hölderlin and Schelling, who had all grappled with Kant's and Fichte's dualisms. It was especially Schelling's Naturphilosophie that inspired Trendelenburg, indeed already during his student years at Kiel, where he was taught by the Danish idealist Johann Erich von Berger (1772-1833). Berger had not only defended an organicist and teleological conception of nature, but also stressed the primacy of motion in mind and matter, one of Trendelenburg's key metaphysical assumptions. Beiser's discussion is very well informed, despite occasionally puzzling claims, such as when he asserts that Hölderlin had rejected Spinoza.

Trendelenburg's reliance on motion as a fundamental metaphysical notion might make him appear to be a materialist, like Hobbes. But as Beiser explains, Trendelenburg's motion is really Aristotelian, which means it is not simply change of place, but also growth, substantial change, coming into being, passing away, hence a feature of life. Motion was held by Trendelenburg to take place also in the mind, for concepts arise through mental constructions, as Kant had already shown with respect to mathematics. Hence, motion is what bridges the inner and the outer, and it underlies, or indeed makes up, the whole of reality.

Motion is the common source of space and time. [As ideas] these are not [pace Kant] ready-made forms, but develop with the first act of thinking. . . . If motion belongs equally fundamentally to thinking as to being, and if space and time are initially created/constructed out of motion, then we find here the harmony of the subjective and the objective which Kant has violently ripped apart. (Logical Investigations, vol. 1, 1862:168)

Since Trendelenburg assumes no distinct spheres here, it is not true that he postulates a pre-established harmony between them, unlike what Kantian critics of Trendelenburg sometimes claim. Beiser is entirely right on this point. He also stresses, correctly, that it is this metaphysics of motion that is the root of Trendelenburg's 'neglected alternative' objection to Kant's transcendental idealism. This is the idea that Kant has failed to substantiate a crucial premise of transcendental idealism, namely the disjunction that space and time can be either subjective (forms of our intuition) or objective (noumenal), from which it would follow, given that Kant demonstrates that they are subjective, that they are not objective. Trendelenburg contends that Kant has overlooked the possibility that space and time are both subjective and objective. Unfortunately, Beiser seems to think, like most interpreters, that Kant has considered this third alternative. In fact, at least in the first Critique, he only considers that space and time are subjective and he considers that space and time are objective, but not the combination (as Hans Vaihinger pointed out already in 1892, in his Commentar, vol. 2, 299ff.).

One important argument Trendelenburg advances concerns the weaknesses of Kant's treatment of motion in the first Critique. At times Kant presents motion, as a determination of an object, as presupposing space (A41), but then again as something that is presupposed by space and time, as 'a pure act of the successive synthesis of the manifold of external intuition', belonging, as such, to transcendental philosophy itself (B154f.). Kant must assume motion as something elementary, which refutes his idealism. Incidentally, Trendelenburg's famous criticism of Hegel, also advanced in Logical Investigations, and very lucidly explained by Beiser, is premised on a similar point: Hegel's dialectical transitions from being to nothing, from nothing to becoming, etc., are based on the more fundamental concept of movement, and, moreover, they smuggle empirical content into Hegel's supposedly pure logic. Also important is Trendelenburg's contention that 'Kant has failed to prove how the ready-made forms of space and time resting in us cooperate to bring about motion' (vol. 1, 1862:166). More work waits to be done in this area. While Beiser does not go into the details of such arguments, he does remind us of some valuable rejoinders by Fischer against Trendelenburg, and generally provides us with a vivid recapitulation of the Trendelenburg-Fischer controversy, including biographical factors that explain why the debate grew increasingly more sour.

Beiser presents Trendelenburg in turn as an empiricist, Aristotelian, Platonist, transcendental realist and absolute idealist. In this combination, these labels are slightly vague. Might Trendelenburg not have been simply an eclectic philosopher, trying to reconcile too many conflicting currents? For Beiser, Trendelenburg is an idealist, because he believes that reality is a single organism and everything conforms to a single purpose. This purpose seems to be Plato's God, the form of the good, but Trendelenburg, a devout Protestant, does not tell us much more. Occasionally Trendelenburg claims that he is an idealist, but then again he also claims some sort of middle position between idealism and realism: 'Realism without the Idea becomes materialism, and idealism without access to the real becomes a dream of mere idea [Vorstellung]' (vol. 2, 1862:488). At one point Beiser attempts to prove that Trendelenburg was an absolute idealist, because he used the objective idealists' catch phrase 'to show the ideal in the real'. But Trendelenburg only writes 'to ground the ideal in the real' ('das Ideale im Realen befestigen')[4], which gives more independent credit to the real. Still, the connection between Trendelenburg and a figure such as Schelling unearthed by Beiser remains remarkable.

Beiser's book contains many other exciting episodes. It presents Trendelenburg's ingenious attempt to revive natural right against competitors, such as contract theory and divine right theory, by going back to Plato and Aristotle. It points out in which respects Lotze was a forerunner of Frege, i.e., by having a (Kantian) normative conception of logic, by proposing the substitution of the determinate with the indeterminate as a method of concept formation, by 'replacing' concepts with functions, and generally by orienting logic towards mathematics and away from the Aristotelian syllogistic. It spells out in detail Lotze's aesthetic theory, which rejected not only neo-classicism and Herbart's formalism, but also Hegel's thesis about the end of art based on the assumptions that art is myth (false for Lotze) and myth is dead (true for Lotze -- he was overhasty here). Here we learn that Lotze defended the possibility of a new and glorious future for art, different from both ancient art venerating nature and Christian art longing for another world, and more in tune with the 'new infinite universe of modern science which makes it impossible to feel at home in this world or to get beyond it' (204). Beiser also shows how both thinkers tried to defend, heroically, but maybe not successfully, a teleological understanding of life, and to grapple with Darwin. And he introduces us to their political ideas. Both, but especially Trendelenburg, were broadly adherents of the ideals of the Enlightenment, such as education, individual freedom, and the importance of thinking for oneself. These were important ideals in Trendelenburg's and Lotze's age of growing specialization and illiberal political ideologies, and they are so even today.

[1] Especially in Frege’s essay "On the Scientific Justification of a Concept-Script " (1882). Trendelenburg’s Leibniz essay is "Ueber Leibnizens Entwurf einer allgemeinen Charakteristik", in A. Trendelenburg, Historische Beiträge zur Philosophie, Berlin, 1867.

[2] See G. Gabriel, "Frege, Lotze, and the Continental Roots of Early Analytic Philosophy", in E. H. Reck, From Frege to Wittgenstein: Perspectives on Early Analytic Philosophy, Oxford 2002.

[3] Köhnke, who also contributed to the editions of the complete works of Simmel and Cassirer, died last year in Berlin at the age of 59.

[4] See Trendelenburg, Kuno Fischer und sein Kant, 1869: 2f.