Later Derrida: Reading the Recent Work

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Rapaport, Herman, Later Derrida: Reading the Recent Work, Routledge, 2003, 158pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415942691.

Reviewed by Catherine Mills , Australian National University


In this book, Herman Rapaport considers Jacques Derrida’s work published in about the past 15 years in relation to cultural studies and more specifically, the work of Trinh Minh-Ha, Gayatri Spivak and Martin Heidegger. In four essays, Rapaport traverses topics such as post-colonialism, monolingualism, trauma and memory, community and society to develop an extremely active interpretation of Derrida that emphasizes the theme of the ’outside’ or other of deconstruction. Given the scope and range of the topics covered, the work promises an illuminating and encompassing - if not exhaustive - interpretation of Derrida’s recent work, and particularly the ethical turn of it. Yet, Rapaport begins the book by stating that he ’makes no attempt to be all-encompassing or definitive’ (vii). Because of this then, there is a sense in which this book is inherently dissatisfying, since it does not give what it promises in the title or its scope of discussion.

The key to reading this book appears in the first chapter. Though ostensibly developing a juxtaposition of deconstruction with the critical methodology of Trinh Min-Ha, this chapter also sets up Rapaport’s own method of exegesis. He argues that Trinh’s Woman, Native, Other epitomizes an ’antagonistic’ strategy of revealing the presence of the other that prevents self-identification or self-presence. Turning this on Derridean deconstruction, Rapaport suggests that Trinh’s method ’channels deconstruction to a destiny [to which] it has not otherwise been disposed to go’, where ’deconstruction comes about as something else or something other than deconstruction’ (9). In particular, the encounter of Trinh’s critical method with deconstruction suggests a future or destiny for deconstruction as a new metaphysics ’at the margins’ of deconstruction. Against Derrida’s early deconstructive critique of metaphysics as logocentric, Rapaport suggests that metaphysics might well re-appear as the ’heteronymous, multicultural and pluralized effect of deconstruction that has the effect of antagonistically putting deconstruction under erasure’ (9). As such, metaphysics re-appears as the other of deconstruction, but only insofar as it is an effect of deconstruction. In other words, metaphysics returns ’on the hither side of deconstruction’ in the form of a metaphysics always already deconstructed.

As interesting as this thesis might be in itself, it also rests on a more general methodological point. The encounter of Derrida’s various formulations of the strategy of deconstruction with Trinh’s method yields a strategy of critical exegesis that rejects representational critique in favor of an anti-mimetic questioning of the ’disposition’ of one’s subject matter. Such a strategy does not seek to give an accurate representation of its object of analysis, but asks instead what it is to speak of or about something. Moreover, this strategy is antagonistic insofar as it reveals the ways in which the text or object of analysis is prevented from becoming one with itself, because of the overdetermined or surplus differences that haunt it. It thus reveals something other than the purported object itself. While he does not state it explicitly, this is effectively the method that Rapaport pursues in his exegesis of the later work of Derrida. Despite what the title augurs then, this book does not, strictly speaking, represent Derrida’s later work in order to develop a critique, immanent or otherwise, of it. Instead, to paraphrase Rapaport, ’supposedly about Derrida’s later work, this book is clearly about something else’ (13).

Since Rapaport does not pursue a single line of argumentation throughout the book, it is difficult at times to see precisely what this something else is, a problem not helped by the fact that while Rapaport claims to consider the relation of deconstruction and cultural studies, there is little in the text that would count as cultural studies in a narrow, disciplinary sense. There is instead, a heavier focus on literary theory, and to this extent, one wonders just how far Rapaport’s focus has shifted from the studies of deconstruction and literature available already. Yet, while Rapaport does not state this explicitly, there is a sense in which the something else that this book is about can be understood broadly as deconstruction’s other, or that which appears on the ’hither side’ of deconstruction, to cite a phrase repeated throughout the essays. More specifically, one might read at least some of the essays as being concerned with the return or recovery of metaphysics on the ’hither side’ of deconstruction, a heteronymous, multicultural and pluralized metaphysics that emerges in the wake of or alongside Derrida’s early critique of logocentrism.

The possible emergence of such a form of metaphysics is best developed in the final essay of the book, in which Rapaport considers the theory of the subject, or the lack thereof, in Derrida’s later work through consideration of his relation to existentialism. Rapaport shows that strictly speaking there is not a theory of the subject in Derrida’s work, but rather, ’bits and pieces… fragments or shards’ (136) of a theory in which the subject itself is ’shattered’ and fragmentary. Drawing on Derrida’s essay on Artaud, ’To Unsense the Subjectile’, and his interview with Jean-Luc Nancy, ’Eating Well’, Rapaport argues that Derrida offers a way of thinking the subject as a ’subjectility’ that does not subscribe to or unwittingly re-inscribe a metaphysics of presence. Rapaport suggests that as such, subjectility can be understood as the ’outer limits’ of Derrida’s thought on the subject without subjectivity, without essence or quiddity. In developing this point, Rapaport links the question of the subject with a recovery of existentialism – or at least of certain Heideggerian problematics – perceived in Derrida’s comments to Nancy, to claim that the subjectile is ’this who that is “called” in the absence of its being given’ (127). In this, the ’who’ stands in for the subject shattered in its fragmentary theorization. Hence, while the subject cannot be simply liquidated, it might be displaced or recast by the subjectile that comes to stand in its place. This is not to say that the subject is effaced by the subjectile, but rather that the subject re-appears or returns as a multiple, fragmented form of itself.

However, while this method provides for novel interpretations of Derrida’s work at times, it also has its limitations, which become evident in the middle essays of the book in which Rapaport is more directly concerned with Derrida’s work during the 1990s. What is somewhat curious about these central chapters to note initially is that while they discuss the work of the 1990s, focus lies largely on two smaller essayistic publications from Derrida, namely, Archive Fever and Monolingualism of the Other, a choice that Rapaport justifies on the basis that these texts represent ’some of the strongest work of this period’ (viii). Apart from the contestability of this strategic claim, this choice of texts is doubly problematic given that major texts such as Specters of Marx and Politics of Friendship receive scant attention even when the arguments being made would seem to demand a more rigorous attention to precisely these texts. This is particularly evident in the argument that the ethical turn of Derrida’s work rests on and re-works the sociological distinction between Gemeinschaft and Gesellschaft, or community and society.

In the most substantial essay of the collection, ’Monolingualism and Literature’, Rapaport considers Derrida’s thought on the gift, passion, testimony and exceptionality to argue that ’the monolingualism of the other … is a law unto itself, a law of exception, that is, of the circle or cult that won’t avail itself to skeptical inspection and callous audit’ (73). In doing so, he harnesses Derrida’s considerations of literature to the distinction between Gemeinschaft and Gesellschaft, to bring out the way in which this distinction underlies Derrida’s later work and indeed, makes it comprehensible (50). Rapaport argues that Derrida is deeply concerned with the existence of small societies or groups in which face-to-face relations characteristic of Gemeinschaft take place. While conceding that Derrida does not actually invoke these terms, he claims that Derrida is nevertheless constructing a ’negative theology’ of Gemeinschaft, but in such a way that Gemeinschaft and Gesellschaft exist simultaneously, rather than the latter superseding the former as sociologists and other theorists of modernity have argued. In other words, Derrida takes a synchronic perspective on Gemeinschaft and Gesellschaft rather than the more common diachronic view. Further, Rapaport claims that the essence of Gemeinschaft is expressed in literature, thus establishing a direct connection between the literary, the political and the sociological. He also suggests that this connection is central to understanding the ethical turn in Derrida’s work during the 1990s, such that Derrida’s ethical turn is theoretically inseparable from his sociology and theory of literature.

While one might expect that Politics of Friendship, in which Derrida examines the paradoxical formulation that ’O my friends, there is no friend’ to trace the horizon of a politics of amity rather than enmity and in doing so, reformulate the relation of ethics and politics, might yield strong support for these claims, Rapaport makes surprisingly little reference to this text. What he does say of it is limited to half a paragraph, in which he claims that Derrida ’counterpoints the small community that is formed by friendship … with the larger social question posed by the political philosopher Carl Schmitt of friends and enemies in the social sphere of the nation and its political apparatuses’ (51). Apart from the superficiality of this description of Politics of Friendship, the implication that emerges throughout the essay is that Gemeinschaft is at base analogous to or perhaps more accurately the arena of ethics, whereas politics correlates with the impersonal relations of Gesellschaft. But this is a problematic association, which seems to ignore Derrida’s construal of the conditional interrelation and hiatus between ethical responsibility and the political decision. Ultimately, what is required here is further examination of the structure of the decision in Derrida’s work, as well as the themes of messianicity and historicity. To be fair, this absence of reference is not necessarily a problem in itself; but, in this context, it both leaves Rapaport’s argument open to critique and reveals the downside of his interpretive focus on the antagonistic differences of deconstruction.

As illuminating as the exegetical strategy that Rapaport pursues might be at times, it also has the effect that the arguments that he is attempting to establish are sometimes unnecessarily elusive and the implications of them are often unelaborated. This is because this strategy for ’reading the recent work’ tends to push Rapaport’s critical focus away from some of Derrida’s key texts that one might expect to be covered in a book that claims to be a ’necessary companion’ for students of his work. In this sense then, while Rapaport develops often insightful and original interpretations of the texts taken up, the book is not, strictly speaking, about Derrida’s ’later work’, but is more about what might be found on the ’hither side’ of deconstruction. At times, the problems this generates are further enhanced by the fact that the claims made are sometimes insufficiently elaborated or the detailed textual evidence that would support the claims is not provided. Thus, while Rapaport deftly draws together a number of strands and themes within this short collection of essays, the detail and conceptual architecture required to fill out the arguments is simply not there. Instead, Rapaport approaches his arguments in broad brush-strokes, which allow him to cover much ground, but in a way that often leaves one wondering why it is that Derrida’s later work should be understood in this particular way. Hence, even accepting that Rapaport is not aiming to provide a comprehensive account of the later Derrida, one is nevertheless left with the sense that this is ’one of those missed opportunities for discussion that cries out for elaboration’ (27).