Later Medieval Metaphysics: Ontology, Language, and Logic

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Charles Bolyard and Rondo Keele (eds.), Later Medieval Metaphysics: Ontology, Language, and Logic, Fordham University Press, 2013, 314pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823244737.

Reviewed by Christopher M. Brown, The University of Tennessee at Martin


Dedicated to pioneering medievalist Paul Vincent Spade, this stimulating collection focuses on the work of important late medieval philosophical figures, including St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274), Dietrich von Freiberg (1250-1310), John Duns Scotus (1265-1308), Walter Burley (1274-1344), Walter Chatton (1285-1343), William of Ockham (1285-1347), Robert Holcot (1290-1349), and John Buridan (1295-1361). Charles Bolyard and Rondo Keele, want to "bring the reader the very latest research on this rich and relatively understudied era of philosophical thought" (p. 7). According to them, the intended readership is primarily those who work in medieval philosophy. These essays are certainly must-reads for that group. But Bolyard and Keele also list non-medievalists as a second intended audience. Not all, but many, of the essays succeed in building a bridge between the late medieval philosophers discussed here and philosophers who are not medievalists. The essays by Gyula Klima, Brian Francis Conolly, Susan Brower-Toland, Terence Parsons, and Rondo Keele are particularly successful in that regard.

The volume is split into four sections. The first treats important and characteristic metaphysical topics of medieval philosophy: essence, existence, and the subject of metaphysics. The section begins with Rega Wood's "Duns Scotus on Metaphysics as the Science of First Entity," which consists of a very technical discussion (non-medievalists beware!) of Scotus' views on what the discipline of metaphysics is really about. Wood argues Scotus' most mature view -- that God is the subject of metaphysics, where metaphysics is really an imperfect science -- is found in Scotus' discussion of the topic in his Questions on Aristotle's Metaphysics.

Gyula Klima's essay, the section's last, is an excellent example of a piece of writing on the history of philosophy that is itself truly philosophical. Klima defends Thomas Aquinas' argument in De ente et essentia that essence and existence are distinct in creatures (but not in God) against a number of objections. First, he examines Anthony Kenny's recent objections to the argument, carefully noting that Kenny does not actually engage Aquinas' argument. Second, Klima shows that Aquinas' argument appears to be vulnerable to a criticism leveled against it by fourteenth-century philosopher John Buridan. Klima points out, however, that, like Kenny's objection, Buridan's fails to engage Aquinas' actual argument, since he differs from Aquinas in his understanding of a crucial locution in the argument -- what it is to have a scientific concept of a thing. After responding to one last objection to Aquinas' argument, Klima closes with a philosophically interesting observation: there is no need to conclude from the different conceptual positions of Aquinas and Buridan that there is no way to arbitrate the question whether Aquinas' argument in De ente et essentia is a good one. But doing so, he observes, would require evaluating the philosophical systems of Aquinas and Buridan as a whole.

The second section treats form and matter in later medieval philosophy. Bolyard writes on Scotus' metaphysical and epistemological views on accidents in Scotus' commentary on the Metaphysics of Aristotle. Bolyard notes a couple of interesting tendencies in Scotus' account of accidents. When the metaphysics of accidents is at issue, Scotus defends an account that makes accidents more independent of substances than previous medieval Aristotelians (such as Aquinas) admitted. Bolyard points out that Scotus defends such a view not only by invoking the independence of accidents from their subjects in the miraculous case of the Eucharist, but also in the case of the transmission of sound, where, on Aristotelian principles, it appears as though accidents naturally exist independent of substances. In speaking about our cognition of accidents, Bolyard argues that Scotus -- at least in his Metaphysics commentary -- is committed to a kind of radical skepticism regarding Aristotelian science in the natural world in this life. This is because Scotus argues we can't know accidents without knowing the substances in which they inhere and we can't know substances at all in this life. It's difficult not to imagine some historical link here between Scotus and Locke.

Also included in the section is Brian Francis Conolly's paper, one of the strongest and most provocative in the collection. My review will focus on it. The paper treats Dietrich von Freiberg, a Dominican philosopher/scientist, and his (non-Thomistic) defense of Aquinas' doctrine of the unity of substantial form against a certain Franciscan objection to the doctrine. Aquinas famously defends the view that each and every material substance has only one substantial form. For example, each human being has one substantial form, the intellectual soul, which, when it configures matter, confers on that human being all of her essential properties such as being rational, being alive, and being corporeal. One advantage of Aquinas' theory is that it protects the high degree of unity thought to be enjoyed by substances such as human beings.

But there is a potential theological problem for Aquinas' view. The Christian tradition (expressed, for example, in a passage from St. Athanasius) has it that Christ's body in the Virgin's womb, Christ's living body on the cross, and Christ's body in the tomb are numerically identical. But when a living substance S is corrupted, S's substantial form and matter are separated from one another. According to the unity of substantial form doctrine, since S's substantial form confers on S all of S's essential properties, the corpse that remains after corruption is not specifically the same substance as S, and a fortiori it is not numerically the same substances as S. Thus, the objection goes, the unity of substantial form doctrine is inconsistent with the Christian tradition and its understanding of Christ's body in the tomb.

As Conolly notes, Aquinas is aware of the problem. He argues that, because Christ is a divine person, and the divine hypostasis was never separated from the body of Christ, this is sufficient to explain why Christ's body in the tomb is numerically identical to Christ's body in the Virgin's womb. Notice that Aquinas' solution makes Christ's dead body a special case. One could point out (as Conolly does not) that Catholic Christian orthodoxy (the theological context at issue in these discussions) also believes in the reality and power of the relics, e.g., body parts, of the saints. So Aquinas can't use his defense of the identity of Christ's living body on the Cross and Christ's dead body in the tomb to explain the efficacy of the relics of the saints (for Aquinas' own account of the identity of a saint's living body and her bodily relics, see Summa theologiae IIIa. q. 25, a. 6, obj. 1 and ad1).

Franciscans such as Richard Middleton (1249-1302) found Aquinas' defense of the identity of Christ's living and dead body unconvincing and had an alternative theory that more easily explained that identity: the doctrine of plural substantial forms. According to this theory, the rational soul explains why a living, human being has the (capacity for the) ability to reason and to will. But human beings also have an additional substantial form that explains the sensitive capacities and powers of human beings, and still another substantial form that explains the presence of human vegetative capacities. Accordingly, the human being also has an additional substantial form that explains the corporeity of the human being. At death, the substantial forms of the rational soul, sensitive soul, and vegetative soul are lost, but the form of corporeity remains. On this theory, not only is the numerical identity of Christ's living body and his body in the tomb easily explained, but the same (potentially) goes for the living and dead bodies of all human beings.

At this point, Conolly, by way of a careful exegesis of Dietrich's texts, explains why Dietrich finds the plurality theory's account of the unity of Christ's living and dead body to be problematic. Dietrich raises two principle objections to the pluralist theory: first, the pluralist theory cannot account for the living body's receptiveness to the rational soul and the latter's lack of receptiveness; second, if dead and living bodies have numerically the same form of corporeity, as the pluralist contends, the pluralist cannot explain why dead bodies do not sometimes naturally come back to life.

Although he is a defender of his fellow-Dominican Aquinas' unity theory of substantial form against the pluralist theory, Dietrich differs from Aquinas in his explanation of the identity of Christ's living body and Christ's body in the tomb. According to him, an embryo is potentially a fully mature human being, and so lacks (in the sense of privation) the form of a fully mature human being. A dead human body also lacks (in the sense of privation) the form of a mature, human being. Although a dead human body clearly is not lacking the form of a mature human being in the same manner an embryo lacks such a form (for the embryo is, while a dead human body is not, potentially a mature human being), a dead human body does suffer a privation of being a mature, human being, which kind of privation Dietrich calls aptitudinal being.

Dietrich therefore suggests there is an interesting analogy to be drawn between the embryo and the corpse. Both entail a privation of the form of a fully mature human being, a privation that other things do not have. For example, an oak tree is not potentially a mature human being; neither can an oak tree be such that it was formerly a mature human being. With this analogy in mind, Dietrich argues that, just as an embryo (the being in potency in relation to the fully mature human being) is numerically identical to a mature human being, so the corpse can be thought of as numerically identical to the living human body. Notice that if Dietrich's theory works, then it explains the identity of Christ's living body and Christ's body in the tomb without making Christ's situation a special case, and it can do so while also taking into account the fact that dead human bodies are not naturally receptive of souls (a fact left unexplained, according to Dietrich, by the pluralist theory of substantial form).

A feature of Dietrich's theory not mentioned by Conolly, but theologically significant nonetheless, is that if Dietrich's theory works, it can also make sense of the traditional Catholic belief that the relics of the saints (specifically, their body parts) retain an essential relationship to those saints. For example, suppose a Benedictine monastery really has a finger of St. Meinrad (d. 861). This finger is owed veneration according to the teachings of the Catholic Church. Dietrich's way of defending the numerical identity of Christ's body in the womb of the Virgin and Christ's body in the tomb is part of a general theory of the identity that obtains between living and dead bodies such that it can also be used to make sense of the potency of the relics of the saints.

As Conolly notes, however, the strength of Dietrich's theory depends upon the strength of the comparison between the embryo and the mature human being on one hand, and the living human body and a corpse on the other. Granted there is some sort of essential relation between the corpse and the living human being (not just anything has the aptitude to be a corpse of a human being), it seems there is a radical difference between these two cases that is not sufficiently emphasized by Dietrich, or Conolly, for that matter. For 'embryo' (or, if one wants another example, 'child') is a phase sortal that picks out a stage in the life of a human being, a life which, ideally, culminates in the biological, intellectual, and spiritual maturity of numerically the same human being. But 'human corpse' is clearly not a phase sortal of a human being, let alone numerically the same human being, even granting that human corpses have some sort of essential relation to the human substances from which they originate.

The third section begins with Martin Tweedale's "Universals." He articulates Avicenna's account of natures (types) and particulars (tokens) as a way of solving a metaphysical puzzle. Tweedale offers an account of that puzzle in the context of addressing the views of Alexander of Aphrodisias (fl. 200 AD) on universals. According to Alexander, (a) universals are ontologically prior to particulars, i.e., they cause particulars to be in a certain way rather than some other way, e.g., this animal is a dog (and not a cat). In addition, (b) some particulars exist independently of human thought, (c) universality is accidental to whatever it belongs to, (d) universality is a function of abstract thinking, and (e) universals do not exist independently of human thought. These theses -- particularly, (a), (b), (d) and (e) -- are logically inconsistent with one another. For if we affirm (a), (d) and (e) -- which Alexander apparently wants to do -- then (b) is false. But it's not clear which premise Alexander should (or can) reject. Since Alexander is a realist, he can't reject (a), for a realist such as Alexander thinks universals constitute the essence of a particular substance. Rejecting (b), which entails idealism, is also repugnant to Alexander. But rejecting (d) or (e) would mean accepting some sort of Platonism, which is out of the question for an Aristotelian such as Alexander.

According to Tweedale, Avicenna's solution to the puzzle has him accepting "the core" of Alexander's positions on universals -- (c) and (d) above -- while rejecting (a). He can consistently do this, according to Tweedale, since he thinks it need not be universals that are ontologically prior to particulars, but rather essences or natures. According to Avicenna, essences or natures (or types) can be considered in (at least) three ways. In one way, we can consider an essence or nature just in itself, i.e., per se. We can also consider an essence or nature insofar as it is en-mattered, e.g., insofar as it exists in this animal. Finally, we can consider an essence or nature insofar as it is exists as an abstraction in the intellect, i.e., as a universal. The first way of considering an essence or nature, i.e., per se, does not include its being en-mattered or existing as a universal. Agreeing with Alexander, Avicenna thinks universality is accidental to an essence or nature. Thus, Avicenna can interpret (a) as (a1): the essence or nature, e.g., animal, is ontologically prior to any particular animals. Not only is realism therefore safe, given the Avicennian solution, but the original metaphysical puzzle is solved, since (a1), (b), (c), (d), and (e) are logically consistent.

A question for Avicenna's solution, which Tweedale does not raise, naturally arises. What is the ontological status of the essence or nature itself? According to Tweedale, Avicenna is at pains not to treat the essence or nature as something that exists (p. 124), since that would smack of Platonism. But how can something that does not exist be something that is ontologically prior to particulars, as (a1) has it?

In the next paper, Jack Zupko discusses John Buridan's two different intellectio theories on the nature of universal concepts, where an intellectio theory states that a universal concept is identical to an act of thinking about many similar things at the same time. Although we simply don't know the relationship between Buridan's earlier and later theories, e.g., why he drops the earlier theory for the later, more "mature" theory, Zupko suggests a number of interesting hypotheses.

The last section is appropriately entitled, "Language, Logic, and Metaphysics." In her engaging and well-written "Can God Know More? A Case Study in Late Medieval Discussions of Propositions," Susan Brower-Toland traces a debate about God's knowledge in the thinking of William of Ockham, Walter Chatton, and Robert Holcot. Brower-Toland makes it clear that in answering the theological question, "can God know more?" each of the three thinkers engages in philosophical projects that will be of interest even to those who don't have an interest in the original theological question, for example, "what is it for something to be an object of belief or knowledge in the first place?" After noting some problems contemporary readers are bound to raise for Ockham's, Chatton's, and Holcot's theories, Brower-Toland renders intelligible each of the theories by making clear what it is for something to be an object of a propositional attitude for each theorist. Since each thinker answers the question of what it is for something to be an object of a propositional attitude differently, Brower-Toland argues traditional taxonomies of late medieval theories of propositional attitudes are overly simplistic, ignoring as they do, this important question.

Terence Parsons, in "The Power of Medieval Logic," shows to what extent late medieval logic is capable of doing what can be done by modern predicate calculus. He argues that, in fact, there is little that can be done in predicate calculus that can't also be done in the system of logic developed by late medieval philosophers such as Burley, Ockham, and Buridan. That being said, late medieval philosophers did not actually make use of this logic to solve problems for which predicate calculus was naturally suited, and this probably explains why the Aristotelian logic developed by later medieval philosophers was abandoned in favor of predicate calculus.

In "Iteration and Infinite Regress in Walter Chatton's Metaphysics," Keele discusses Chatton's anti-razor principle and explains Chatton's defense of such a principle against an Ockham's razor-style objection. Keele also shows how an obscure remark of Chatton's can reasonably be interpreted as Chatton's attempt to show that his anti-razor principle does not undermine his own solution to the problem of future contingents.

In the final paper, E. Jennifer Ashworth offers an account (and explanation) of differing views on analogy and metaphor in the twelfth, thirteenth, and fourteenth centuries. Before speaking in detail about the views of Aquinas, Scotus, and Burley, Ashworth provides a helpful history of the major sources for such later medieval reflections on analogy and metaphor. Ashworth also appends translations of two important texts from Scotus on analogy.

In closing, I should mention that the volume needs additional copy-editing. I found a missing word or an extra word, on average, every twelve pages, which is particularly problematic in a work that treats such dense material. But, over-all, this is a very successful anthology. The contents demonstrate amply why some of us find medieval philosophy so fascinating: here are discussions of some of the perennial questions in metaphysics conducted at the very highest level of rigor. The authors ably show why contemporary metaphysicians and philosophers of religion neglect the work of later medieval philosophers at their own intellectual peril.