Plato's Symposium: A Critical Guide

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Pierre Destrée and Zina Giannopoulou (eds.), Plato's Symposium: A Critical Guide. Cambridge University Press, 2017, 268pp., $80.00, ISBN 9781108180344.

Reviewed by G.R.F. Ferrari, UC Berkeley


In a scholarly world awash with multi-author handbooks, companions, and guides, the series of "Companions" and "Critical Guides" issued in great number by Cambridge University Press have the merit of complementing each other. The Companions are aimed more toward students and teachers, attempt a comprehensive treatment of their topic, and envisage the longue durée; the Critical Guides address a specialist audience of scholars and graduate students and are free to focus on topics currently debated among those specialists. Typically, the Guides will deal with single works or themes rather than with a figure's entire oeuvre. This Critical Guide to Plato's Symposium fits the mold admirably. No fewer than six of its thirteen contributions (those by Sedley, Sheffield, Nightingale, Shields, Price, and Destrée) home in on the goal of philosophic ascent in Diotima's speech and the characteristic activity of the philosopher who has achieved it. Does the philosopher aim for a godlikeness that expresses itself in a purely intellectual and, at least in principle, solitary way (the intellectualist position); or does the philosopher not rest at the summit of the ascent but instead pursues the vision of Beauty in the exercise of moral virtue, in shared philosophic discussion aimed at morally improving one's interlocutors, perhaps even in a care of the soul that would belong within an enlightened political life (the moralist position)? While at least some of these six chapters deal in addition with other, related concerns, to read this volume from cover to cover and continuously (as perhaps few of its readers will do) is to be given a bracing work-out by the intellectualist and moralist teams, each claiming the reader for its side.

The remaining seven contributions explore varied territory: two early chapters discuss how the scene is set (Zina Giannopoulou) and how the first four speeches hang together as a group (Jeremy Reid); there are studies of single speeches (Franco Trivigno on Eryximachus; Suzanne Obdrzalek on Aristophanes; Francisco Gonzalez on Agathon); a piece by the classicist Radcliffe Edmonds updates our historical understanding of the Mysteries, with implications for their use in the dialogue; a final chapter by Richard Kraut challenges the orthodoxy that Plato is a eudaemonist and applies the lesson of that challenge to the analysis of Platonic eros. The six chapters by the intellectualists and the moralists, for their part, are organized principally by theme (divinization, the nature of eros, immortality, etc.); Anthony Price comes nearest to giving an account of Diotima's speech as a whole. Formally speaking, then, and in line with the parameters of the series, the editors have allowed the collection to be something of a miscellany, with relatively little attention paid to certain aspects and portions of the dialogue. In particular, the pattern of erotic relationships in 5th-4th century Greek culture gets relatively scanty treatment, as do the speeches of Phaedrus and Pausanias, in which such relationships figure most prominently. (Those speeches make an appearance in Reid's chapter alone.) Overall, the editors are to be congratulated for ensuring that a good range of prominent scholarly approaches and environments are represented.

One anomaly bears mention, however: although the articles by David Sedley and by Richard Kraut are of independent importance and to be recommended to the attention of all Plato scholars, they are only tangentially related to the Symposium. Sedley's analysis of Aristophanes' speech in his chapter "Divinization" is in aid of the much broader intellectualist thesis that true human happiness for Plato consists in contemplation. Diotima's speech comes up as one representative among others of Platonic intellectualism; but it is by no means the focus of the article. The focus falls instead on the Timaeus, here unequivocally extolled as Plato's most systematic work, which at least in this respect puts the Symposium in the shade. Kraut, too, has a broad Platonic thesis to argue: that Plato is, properly speaking, no eudaemonist. "The policy of always acting for the sake of one's happiness will never lead one astray . . . But that does not make one's happiness the most valuable object there is" (p. 236). Eudaemonism conflicts with Plato's belief that what should be taken as one's guide to life is something superior to oneself. This is a powerful thought, which Kraut develops with great subtlety over a range of Platonic dialogues. But it is only at chapter's end that he turns to the Symposium.

Rather as with the Symposium itself, whose action and speeches preceding and following the speech of Socrates are typically taken as the appetizers and dessert to Diotima's main dish, those chapters in this volume that do not join in the intellectualist-moralist tussle at its core inevitably come across as satellites, however brightly some of them may shine. Zina Giannopoulou draws a contrast in terms of temporality and eros between the work's two opening scenes: the frame-dialogue with Apollodorus and the subsequent reported preliminaries as Socrates and Aristodemus make their way to Agathon's house. The former scene's concern with retellings of the past she relates to a merely acquisitive model of eros; the latter's concern with progress for the future she relates to Socrates' procreative model of eros. Her treatment of the frame-dialogue convinces; but a concern with time is much less evident in the reported prologue, leading her to force some of the details. Jeremey Reid argues for a parallelism between the first four speeches of the Symposium and the educational program of the Republic. That he does a worthy job of establishing the parallelism makes it the more regrettable that his chapter should fade out toward the end into tentative suggestions.

Francisco Gonzalez aims to rehabilitate Agathon's speech against the prevailing view that it is a merely rhetorical tour de force, lacking in philosophic depth. Acknowledging precedents for his enterprise in work by Michael Stokes and by David Sedley, he marshals an impressive battery of evidence to support the idea that Agathon himself, as a character, is endowed with a genuine concern for genuine philosophic problems. Whether this rescues the speech from the pall cast by "the more blatantly sophistical argumentation" that even Gonzalez has to recognize (p. 115) is debatable. Where Gonzalez rehabilitates, Franco Trivigno "redebilitates." His chapter argues very trenchantly that Doctor Eryximachus is indeed the self-absorbed pedant that an older consensus took him to be, before Edelstein's post-war challenge to that consensus was taken up by a chorus of influential voices in recent decades. Trivigno's chapter is the more convincing because it carefully locates the comic portrayal of Eryximachus in the context of Attic comedy in general, in which medical practitioners are frequent butts of satire and the comic impostor a standard figure.

Suzanne Obdrzalek provides a chapter on the one professional comedian among the speakers, Aristophanes. She contends that, although his speech is of great philosophic importance for the dialogue (launching as it does the conception of love as lack), it is not intended by Plato to offer the independently valuable, quasi-romantic account of love that so many modern readers have taken away from it. On the contrary, Plato wants us to find the speech deeply pessimistic; the love that it presents is futile because misdirected, irrational, and incapable of ultimate satisfaction. Obdrzalek argues very capably; but her view should be balanced against that of Sedley, who sees Aristophanes' lovers as adumbrating the human drive toward godlikeness that comes to fruition in Diotima's speech (p. 94). Kraut, as we saw, makes fundamental to Plato the thought that we should orient our lives by something superior to ourselves; Sedley reminds us that Aristophanes' lovers, in seeking a return to the original and perfect sphericity that made them vie with gods, are, after all, seeking to become something greater as partners than they were as individuals. That their original condition is not fully recoverable need not make their aspiration futile; aspiration can do its work even asymptotically.

Returning now from Aristophanes' battle between Gods and Giants to the battle between intellectualists and moralists, we find, on the one side, David Sedley and Frisbee Sheffield; on the other side, Andrea Nightingale, Christopher Shields, and Pierre Destrée, with Anthony Price pivoting interestingly between the two. Sheffield's full defence of the intellectualist position is mounted in her 2006 monograph on the dialogue; her chapter in the current volume is a careful study of the general hallmarks of eros. Nevertheless, the intellectualist position shows through in one of those hallmarks: "the desiring agent does not desire primarily to effect a change in the beloved object . . . rather, he desires to change himself" (p. 133). The productiveness of eros in Diotima's speech is here understood, at least with regard to the pinnacle of the Ascent, as the production of happiness in the lover through assimilation to the divine. Sedley compares the happiness of the World in the Timaeus, "enjoying its internal rotations of thought in splendid isolation. This confirms that those who attain happiness by replicating its revolutions inside their own heads will be becoming contemplators, not socially or politically virtuous beings" (p. 102 n. 22).

The most spirited and extreme opposition to this idea is found in Destrée's chapter, which centres on the speech of Alcibiades. Unusually, Destrée reads this speech not for its contrast with Diotima's scheme of things, nor even as a mere supplement to that scheme, but "as providing the conclusion Plato's readers should now draw from Diotima's message" (p. 220). Alcibiades, Plato implies, became a failure as a person and as a politician because he did not receive the erotic education from Socrates that he craved; had he received it, he would not have failed in these realms; therefore, Socratic education in eros -- which Socrates in turn received from Diotima -- is presented in the Symposium as an education toward moral and political virtue (so Destrée, pp. 220-1). But this conclusion does not inevitably follow. Alcibiades failed both morally and politically, that is true; but even if it is also true that, had he received a Socratic education, he would not have failed in this way, this does not mean that the virtue at which the philosopher aims is moral and political rather than intellectual virtue. There is more than one way to avoid moral and political disaster. What if the exercise of intellectual virtue minimizes the possibility of moral and political disaster by minimizing one's concern for the moral and political realm as such? That is the argument Sedley makes (pp. 103-4), citing the opening of Republic Book 6 and the Digression in the Theaetetus.

Andrea Nightingale and Christopher Shields, in their respective chapters, do not insist so directly as Destrée on the moral and political expression of the philosopher's virtue. What they insist on, rather, is that the philosopher's Ascent does not culminate in the contemplation of Beauty but in giving birth to virtue; and "giving birth to virtue" they take to be an activity like that ascribed by Diotima to the "pregnant in soul," who are inspired to impart an education to those with whom they fall in love. Since that education is a moral education, Nightingale and Shields end up in Destrée's territory. (See Nightingale: p. 152, with n.20; Shields: p. 174). On their interpretation, "giving birth to virtue" tells against the intellectualists' emphasis on self-transformation and contemplation, which is primarily self-directed and, in the case of contemplation, potentially solitary. Nightingale compares the passage from the Phaedrus in which philosophers are said to plant seeds of discourse in the souls of their philosophic companions -- a comparison made also by Anthony Price (pp. 191-3). But whereas Nightingale deploys the parallel in an attempt to portray philosophy as essentially social and the immortal happiness described by Diotima as consisting in this social activity, Price (in line with his earlier work on the topic, which his article for this volume refines in a number of details) contends that so vicarious an immortality would be too contingent on the company one keeps to justify the impregnable triumphalism of Diotima's concluding note in the Ascent. The philosopher's immortality must not depend upon spreading his seed, even if it is good that he do so, and characteristic of his goodness that he will try to do so.

In comparing the summit of the Ascent to the virtuous proselytism of those pregnant in soul, both Nightingale and Shields are consciously minimizing the distinction between what scholars have taken Diotima to be comparing, respectively, to the "Lesser" and "Greater Mysteries." Destrée, for his part, contends that "nothing really indicates that the lesser mysteries are to be left behind once one has reached the highest mysteries" (p. 230).

Whatever we think of this view, we should not turn to Radcliffe Edmonds' chapter on Alcibiades as profaner of the Mysteries in order to support it. Edmonds provides an eminently useful corrective to some well-entrenched views of the Mysteries: they were not designed to transmit some secret doctrine but rather to offer an experience of confirmation (adepts are to be confirmed in their relation to the divine); the experience, being repeatable, would be more akin in Christian terms to a pilgrimage than to receiving baptism; Alcibiades' profanation was not intended as mockery but was rather a tyrannical arrogation to himself, as private hierophant, of what ought to be a public good. Edmonds also points out that the Lesser Mysteries at Agra and the Greater Mysteries at Eleusis were two quite distinct festivals, whereas the levels of "initiation" and "final witnessing" (epopsis) mentioned by Diotima at 210a are two levels of participation in a single festival, that of the Greater Mysteries at Eleusis. Scholars of Plato may well, then, be guilty of having employed a misnomer when they speak of Diotima's alluding to the Lesser and Greater Mysteries. But this particular correction leaves unchanged the debate between intellectualists and moralists, since it is unclear whether "final witnessing" -- whatever exactly it was -- is a better analogue for a philosophic experience that merely completes what "initiation" had begun (which would suit the moralists) or for one that quite transcends it (which would suit the intellectualists).