Law and Social Justice

Placeholder book cover

Joseph Keim Campbell, Michael O'Rourke, and David Shier (eds.), Law and Social Justice, MIT Press, 2005, 355pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0262532743.

Reviewed by Wil J. Waluchow, McMaster University


In spring 2002 the philosophy departments of Washington State University and the University of Idaho hosted their annual Inland Northwest Philosophy conference. This book is a collection of papers or descendents of papers presented at those meetings, all on the very broad theme of law and social justice.

The substantial breadth of the conference theme is reflected in the equally substantial breadth of specific topics covered in the volume, which has been organized into three sections. Part I includes papers on a variety of topics in legal and political philosophy. Part II focuses on Wittgenstein and legal theory, while Part III's contributions all derive from a panel convened to ponder the jurisprudential views of Jules Coleman. The volume concludes with a short reply by Professor Coleman. One who sets out to review such an eclectic, wide-ranging collection of essays faces a daunting task. One cannot comment meaningfully on each piece in a way that will be helpful to the reader. Nor is it adequate to single out specific contributions for more detailed analysis and evaluation. Sometimes, when a collection is devoted to a focused question, it is possible to address, and one hopes contribute to, thought on that question. But such a route is not open when the theme is as amorphous as this one. As a result, I shall content myself with brief summaries of the contributions in the order in which they are presented -- with a few critical comments along the way -- followed by some reflections on the usefulness of this kind of collection.

Part I begins with two papers in abstract political philosophy. In "Privacy, Pluralism, and Democracy" Joshua Cohen asks whether robust rights to privacy can be defended from within the framework of "deliberative democracy," a conception which stresses reasonable pluralism and the proposition that coercive social force is legitimate only when founded in "public reasoning." Cohen's answer is that such a defence is possible, but that it is wrong to assume that it depends on a prior commitment to political liberalism, or that the latter view is somehow immune from reasonable rejection. Political liberalism is itself among the options vulnerable to the vicissitudes of reasonable pluralism. In "An Argument for Egalitarian Justice and Against the Leveling-Down Objection," Tom Christiano defends a principle of egalitarian justice, which grounds "the intrinsic justice of equality for at least a limited but important range of cases," (41) against the charge that egalitarians are committed to the superiority of any egalitarian state over any other unequal state, even one in which everyone is far better off (but not equally so). According to Christiano, an egalitarian need only assert that "for every nonegalitarian state there is some (not Pareto-superior) egalitarian state that is superior to the nonegalitarian state." (58-9, emphasis added)

With Carl Cranor's "Justice, Inference to the Best Explanation, and the Judicial Evaluation of Scientific Evidence" one encounters a significant change of gears, from abstract questions of political theory to nuts and bolts questions concerning the use, in American courts, of scientific testimony. According to Cranor, judges, in evaluating scientific evidence in toxic tort cases have fallaciously rejected a form of reasoning central to scientific practice -- "inference to the best explanation." Cranor worries that the courts' fixation on large-scale epidemiological studies and controlled, double-blind clinical trials has led them to reject the legitimacy of this perfectly respectable form of scientific reasoning. The result is often a denial of justice to victims of toxic exposure whose evidence is condemned as unscientific. Nir Eisikovits considers a question first introduced by Bernard Williams and Thomas Nagel: the extent to which moral and legal judgments of responsibility properly hinge on factors beyond the agent's control. So called "subjectivists" typically argue that only our intentions and the acts under which they are directly performed validly ground ascriptions of liability and punishment, since only these are truly under an agent's control. "Objectivists," on the other hand, believe that the amount of harm one actually causes can be equally relevant even though sheer luck often determines whether and to what extent our conduct is harmful. According to Eisikovits, our intuitions pull in two directions here, thus producing an insoluble paradox which can only be described and explained and its effect noted and appreciated.

Next up is Philip Ivanhoe's "Intellectual Property and Traditional Chinese Culture" which traces the historical and intellectual background of China in an attempt to explain why Chinese law and culture do not recognize a robust right to intellectual property. Among the reasons proffered by Ivanhoe is a conception of knowledge according to which ideas and cultural creations are not principally the result of individual effort, but of spontaneous, natural processes that only work through individuals creators. The result is that they never belong to individuals but to everyone. Property rights also serve as the focus of Ann Levey's "Initial Acquisition and the Right to Private Property." Here the question is whether initial acquisition grounds a right to private property. Levey concludes that it can, but only if the right-holder(s) and anyone who later seeks to acquire the property in question share "conventions recognizing the acts as acquisitive." (159) Notoriously, this was not the case when Europeans first came to North America and acquired land then occupied by Native Americans, resulting in a somewhat surprising conclusion: neither party's claim-right -- legal or moral -- to the property in question can possibly be valid against the other.

Can a company be held legally liable for harms caused by its defective products, even when said company was in no way negligent or otherwise at fault? In most everyday contexts, liability without fault is condemned as unjust. But exceptions are sometimes made in product liability cases. Harry Silverstein considers two main arguments in favour of such exceptions, the "make the company shape up argument" and the "distribute the burden argument," concluding that neither is sound. Silverstein then provides his own defence of strict liability, by drawing attention to analogous contexts in which we seem quite prepared to make exceptions -- e.g. the liability of parents and pet owners for harm caused by their charges. On the basis of these analogous cases, Silverstein is prepared to conclude that product liability is not wrong in principle. Part 1 concludes with Leif Wener's discussion of a fairly well-worn topic: the moral foundations of rights. Wener canvasses the usual differences between instrumentalist theories (of which utilitarianism, he reminds us, is but one example) and the "status" or "intrinsic" theories defended by Thomas Nagel and Frances Kamm. The latter see all fundamental moral rights, e.g., the right to free expression, as intrinsically valuable and as resting on our status or worth as independent moral beings. In Wener's view, instrumental theories are preferable on a number of grounds, not least of which is their ability to accommodate important interests beyond those of the right-holder, and of explaining why many legal systems distinguish between, e.g., commercial and political speech.

Part II contains three essays on the use and abuse, in legal theory, of Wittgenstein's thoughts on language and rule following. Brian Bix cautions that we must be extremely careful in co-opting philosophical theories designed for very different purposes. For example, critical theorists often present Wittgenstein's reflections on rule-following as supporting scepticism and indeterminacy as to meaning. Yet as Bix (I think rightly) notes, Wittgenstein's objective was to support the (positive) view that "the only possible source of truth is the agreement of people … considered competent practitioners of the language." (224) As a result, it is at the very least questionable to enlist Wittgenstein in support of a deeply skeptical project. In "Prolegomenon to Any Future Legal Theory: Wittgenstein and Jurisprudence," Dennis Patterson asks how legal concepts come to have the particular content they do. In his view, the work of the later Wittgenstein, combined with the kind of philosophical pragmatism defended by Jules Coleman, provides us with the key to answering this question. Here we find a middle ground between "objectivist" theories of meaning, according to which "the world imprints itself on us and our modes of expression" (231) and "subjectivist" theories of the sort Patterson associates with critical legal studies. In this middle ground we discover that the "understanding of a rule [or concept] is exhibited in one's mastery of the technique for its application." (233) Part II concludes with Tony Sebok's "Legal Process and the Practices of Principle" which explores historical and theoretical connections between Wittgenstein, on the one hand, and the legal process theories of Hart, Sacks and Harry Wellington, and the legal positivism of H.L.A. Hart, on the other.

The theme of Part III is Jules Coleman's The Practice of Principle,[1] an important book with two principal objectives: (a) a sustained defence of Coleman's views on the role of corrective justice in explaining tort law and of his equally influential views on the nature of law (a version of inclusive legal positivism); and (b) a defence of a kind of "philosophical pragmatism" of the sort one associates with philosophers such as Quine, Sellars, Davidson and Putnam. John Gardner begins Part III by calling into question Coleman's claim that law-and-economics theories of the sort advanced by Richard Posner cannot possibly account for central features of modern tort regimes. According to Gardner, there are highly plausible economic reasons for the central rules of tort law, including those which appear most congruent with, and hence supportive of, Coleman's corrective justice account -- e.g., that liability for negligence can be properly assigned only to the one who negligently caused the relevant harm. Coleman's reply is, in effect, to agree with Gardner's premise, but to suggest that this fails to save the economic model. Our choice of theories will hinge, in the end, not on the availability of economic reasons supporting the rules of tort, but on what we would be inclined to say if they did not. What would we be prepared to say if economic values did not in fact line up in support of rules sanctioned by the corrective justice account? If we would continue to demand such rules -- and Coleman thinks we would -- then we have enough to vindicate the theory. Coleman's point will be familiar to those well-schooled in long-standing disputes between utilitarians and their deontological critics. Utilitarians frequently defend conventional or common sense rules of morality -- e.g. always keep one's promises -- by arguing that utility, properly construed, supports always acting in accordance with such rules, even in highly unusual cases where utility would appear to suggest otherwise. Deontologists remain unimpressed by such defences, believing that even if the utilitarian succeeds in getting us the right answers, he gets them for the wrong reasons. This too is evident by asking oneself the appropriate counter-factual question: What would we be prepared to say if the relevant utilities did not line up behind observing the rule(s) almost without exception? If the answer remains "Keep the rules," then one has powerful support for the deontological position.

In "Pragmatism, Positivism, and the Model of Social Facts," Ben Zipursky highlights what he considers a fundamental tension between Coleman's philosophical pragmatism, with its emphasis on holism, (universal) revisability, and so on; and his legal positivism, with its emphasis on social facts as determining and ultimately explaining the nature of law and grounding legal claims -- the social fact thesis. Ronald Dworkin has long argued that positivism's social fact thesis is falsified by deep disagreements among judges over the appropriate grounds for legal claims. Coleman attempts, in The Practice of Principle, to meet Dworkin's challenge by deploying a range of arguments which utilize his philosophical pragmatism coupled with Michael Bratman's theory of "shared co-operative activities" (SCAs). According to Coleman, the grounds of legal claims are determined by an SCA among judges of identifying authoritative legal texts. According to Zipursky, Coleman's arguments point us in the right direction, but they seriously threaten his legal positivism. How, he asks, can one espouse the central elements of philosophical pragmatism -- meaning holism, universal revisability, etc., and then go on to claim that law and legal validity are essentially grounded in social facts? Coleman's reply?

I introduced the idea of an SCA … in order to introduce a way of fixing the content through a practice of cooperation and disagreement … Law is an institutional social practice that necessarily consists in, among other things, a kind of cooperative activity of officials. That activity can be characterized in purely social fact terms: behaviour and psychological states. That is what law is. The content of the criteria or grounds of law will be fixed by the nature of their cooperative venture. (349, emphasis added).

In other words, that such and such (e.g. legislative enactment) is a criterion of law is established by social facts about the cooperative activities of judges -- but these facts are subject to disagreements among judges as they go about applying legal rules. One cannot help but wonder whether Zipursky will be any more satisfied than Dworkin was with this line of defence.

Part III concludes with an essay by Ken Himma who believes that Coleman's theory of law fails to solve "[o]ne of the most stubborn problems facing positivists … to explain how legal norms give rise to legal obligations." (311) According to Himma, Hart's rule of recognition, reconfigured by Coleman as an SCA among judges, "may succeed in explaining how the rule of recognition obligates [judges], but does not succeed in explaining how … legal norms obligate citizens." (Ibid.) The reason is that they are not parties to the commitments judges assume when they participate in their SCA. It has long baffled me why so many legal scholars follow Dworkin's lead in thinking that Hart's analysis of social rules and the internal point of view necessary for their existence, was intended to justify the claim that the existence of legal rules -- or of any other kind of "social rule" -- is sufficient to establish obligations. This bafflement is shared by Coleman who notes that "A cottage industry has grown up around this mistaken reading of Hart." (340) Yet as Coleman correctly notes in his reply to Himma,

The internal point of view is not offered as an explanation of how law creates reasons or obligations. Rather, the adoption of an internal point of view is expressed in behaviour that provides a reliable indicator that participants view their practice as normative, as reason giving. It explains the aptness of terms like "obligation," "right," "duty," and "reason." (341, emphasis added)

In other words, neither Hart's nor Coleman's objective is to justify the claim that judges and/or citizens are under legal obligation. Rather it is to provide the conceptual resources required to identify when participants in legal practice view themselves that way. That it fails to explain why law obligates citizens is therefore neither here nor there.

As noted at the outset, Law and Social Justice is a very mixed bag of interesting essays. There is something here for most everyone, and in that sense the collection has value. But as with any collection of essays lacking a sharp focus one cannot help but wonder whether there will be enough to satisfy any particular reader with her own particular set of interests. Will someone keen to explore abstract questions or political philosophy such as the validity of the "levelling down" objection or the nature of fundamental moral rights have an interest in Chinese property law or the rules of evidence used by American courts? Will someone with an interest in Coleman's inclusive legal positivism be attracted to essays on initial acquisition or the role of public reason in liberal theory? Perhaps. But I can't help but wonder whether readers might be better served by collections which have a sharper focus and hence more to offer the interested reader.

[1] Jules Coleman, The Practice of Principle (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001).