Law is a Moral Practice

Law is a Moral Practice

Scott Hershovitz, Law is a Moral Practice, Harvard University Press, 2023, 236pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674258556.

Reviewed by Brian Leiter, University of Chicago


In the first chapter of his often entertaining but rather exasperating book, Scott Hershovitz gives two different formulations of its central thesis that “law is a moral practice.” In one formulation, “legal practices—like legislation and adjudication—are the sorts of activities that might, in the right circumstances, rearrange people’s moral relationships. That is what I mean when I say that law is a moral practice” (28, emphasis added; cf. 132). This view, however, is trivially true: all kinds of practices (not just legal ones) “might, in the right circumstances” change our moral relationships with each other. (If my neighbor regularly leaves garbage on my lawn, this will change our moral relationship, e.g., I will be morally justified in bringing a civil action against him, and I will no longer have an obligation to be neighborly towards him.)

In other places, he states the thesis differently: “law is a moral practice, in that it aims to adjust our moral relationships” (36, emphasis added; cf. 103) or, similarly, “When I say that law is a moral practice, I mean that we employ legal practices in an effort to adjust who owes what to whom” (24, emphasis added; cf. 96) (morality, for Hershovitz, concerns “what we owe each other” (21), by which he means the moral realist thesis “what we genuinely owe each other, not what we believe we owe each other” (22)); or, “legal practices are tools for adjusting our moral relationships, and they are typically employed for the purpose of doing so” (18, emphasis added). This latter view does not seem trivial, nor is it (contrary to Hershovitz (27)) one everyone in jurisprudence accepts (Hershovitz cites only Joseph Raz in the text—who may accept it on one understanding—but he makes no mention in this regard of any of the major figures of 20th century jurisprudence like H.L.A Hart, Hans Kelsen, Norberto Bobbio, and Alf Ross who do not accept it). In what sense, though, does the law “aim” or have as its “purpose” the altering of moral relationships?

On a natural reading, Hershovitz seems to mean that legal actors typically intend to alter moral relationships through the law, but this seems implausible. An alteration in moral relationships might be an effect of legal actions, but where is the evidence that it is the typical intention? On the standard public choice account of legislation, for example, law makers intend only to satisfy the interests of their largest donors who make their campaigns for reelection possible. On one kind of Marxist account, law makers intend to promote the interests of the ruling class. Although there is plentiful evidence for both the latter accounts (Hershovitz seems to think, without explanation or evidence, that such possibilities are “deviant” (28)), one need not accept them to still be skeptical of the claim that legal actors typically intend to alter moral relationships.

Perhaps, for example, people employ law primarily for self-interested reasons (to get what they want, without any regard for moral relationships)? Again, adjusting the moral rights and obligations may be a consequence, but not the reason (or motive), for employing law. The Tax Cuts and Jobs Act of 2017 was intended to cut taxes (for self-interested or other reasons), but its proponents would be astonished to learn that their actual intention was to change moral relationships, even if the effect of the Act can be redescribed in those terms. They have no de dicto intention to change moral relationships, even if, by Hershovitz’s lights, we can ascribe to them a de re intention to do so. But as with the first formulation in terms of possible effects in the right circumstances on moral relationships, this interpretation now seems to make the claim, once again, trivial: once you define morality the way Hershovitz does, it follows that any law (or any other activity) which changes people’s rights or obligations has a “moral” effect (or can be described as “moral”), even when no one de dicto intends that (Hershowitz finally admits as much at 192). This makes law a “moral practice” in the same sense that Mafia protection rackets are “moral practices”: they certainly change people’s rights and obligations.[1]

The tautological character of the book’s central thesis plays a large role. For example, it is true on this reading that “the questions posed in court are moral questions as well as legal questions” (38). The problem is they are answered legally, not morally, at least when the law is determinate. When it is not, of course moral considerations may affect a court’s decision in a particular case, but no one has ever denied that latter point. Dworkin advanced the view that one must always rely on moral considerations to say what the law is, and it seems Hershovtiz does too: “judges must rely on their moral views to resolve the cases that come before them” (56, emphasis added; cf. 175: “moral assessment is internal to legal judgment”), i.e., not just in cases where the law runs out.

His main argument for this latter claim appears in Chapter 2 and is based on a reading of a U.S. Supreme Court case, King v. Burwell (2016), involving interpretation of the Affordable Care Act. Hershovitz observes that the late Justice Antonin Scalia offered normative arguments for textualism as a theory of statutory interpretation in his extra-judicial writings, primarily based on the rule of law value of “publicity” (and fair notice) and the constitutional requirement of separation of powers between the judiciary and the legislature. Hershovitz seizes (63–64) on some language at the end of Chief Justice Roberts’ majority opinion, and Justice Scalia’s dissent, in Burwell to suggest that their disagreement was really a moral one, “over competing visions of democracy and the proper role of judges within one” (65). In fact, most of both opinions concerned the meaning of the statute, with Scalia laser-focused on one word in one sentence, while Roberts argued that Scalia’s reading would render the statute self-defeating given the other parts of the text. Even if we take the concluding remarks in the opinion as evidence of the more ambitious moral debate, as Hershovitz does, this does not show “judges must rely on their moral views to resolve the cases that come before them” (56). It may only show that Burwell, like many cases that end up in the Supreme Court (cf. Leiter 2015), had no right legal answer, so unsurprisingly the judges had to exercise moral and political judgment to resolve it.

Chapter 3 is Hershovitz’s most explicit attack on legal positivism, “the thesis that the content of the law is determined by social facts” (84).[2] Hershovitz claims that “positivism. . .is false when it comes to the set of norms that is contested in court” because “courts attempt to ascertain and apply the norms that are authoritative. . .[i.e.,] in virtue of moral principles that establish their authority” (85). The latter is obviously false (courts purport to rely on the norms that are legally valid), although I suppose Hershovitz thinks Chapter 2 established it. It may be true that in some decisions by the appellate courts, where law is often indeterminate, judges avert to non-legal considerations, moral or otherwise. This shows nothing about what most courts do most of the time, and nothing about the nature of law. (Recall that one of Hart’s central claims was that law exists primarily outside the courts, as a way of guiding conduct; his was not a theory about appellate adjudication, but like Ronald Dworkin, Hershovitz does not notice.)

Hershovitz wants to deny that law is “a set of norms” in Chapter 3, but his reasons are obscure. He notices that the word “law” is polysemous (see esp. 93), and thus can pick out different sets of norms (one might add: it can also pick out things other than norms, e.g., laws of nature). He offers a list of possibilities, suggesting that Hart offers an account of law as “norms that are accepted by legal officials,” but not of “norms that are authoritative” (82), where “authoritative” means those we “have reason to comply with” (74, cf. 86). Hart’s actual theory—namely that where law exists there is a rule of recognition that specifies the criteria other norms must satisfy to count as norms of the legal system, and the criteria making up the rule of recognition are those that officials converge upon and treat as ones they ought to apply (i.e., that they treat as authoritative, rightly or wrongly)—is not fairly represented on Hershovitz’s list of possibilities. To use Hershovitz’s terminology, Hart’s view is that in modern municipal legal systems, our shared concept treats law as the “norms that are accepted as authoritative by officials,” although even that is not quite right for reasons we can consign to a note.[3]

Hershovitz, I think, would reject even the latter. He makes the astonishing claim that “the original sin among philosophers of law is the rigid insistence that this and not that set of norms counts as the law of the community” (83). One can, of course, reject a central question of general jurisprudence for at least two centuries—namely, what is the difference between those norms that are legal and those norms that are not—but there should be a good reason for doing so.[4] After all, when I want to make a valid will in Illinois, I go see my lawyer and not a moral philosopher: I want to know what legal norms govern the making of wills in my jurisdiction, not what norms morally ought to govern them, even in light of past institutional actions in Illinois. Hershovitz says that “What’s at issue” in court “is the norms that are [morally] authoritative” (83), but this is not true: all that matters is the norms that are legally valid, regardless of whether we have all-things-considered reasons to comply with them. That’s why morally indifferent lawyers can do good legal work.

In Chapter 4, Hershovitz considers laws and legal systems that are immoral and argues that “some aspects of immoral practices may [nonetheless] generate genuine [moral] obligations” (111). He does not offer a general theory of when bad laws generate moral obligations (which is what his theory would seem to require), but does discuss some suggestive examples. Citing Nazi Germany and some others, he observes that a legal system can be so immoral “that it is worth casting the system aside and seeking something better, even if that risks the abyss” (104). No one, including legal positivists, disagrees with that. Do those places have “legal systems”? Hershovitz doesn’t say, not wanting to commit the original sin I suppose.

Chapter 5 offers a nuanced exploration of the “moral consequences our legal practices might have” (132), although for reasons I do not understand, Hershovitz frames this as a dispute with the more familiar question about whether there is an obligation to obey the law just because it is the law. He says the latter is a question of “marginal importance” (112), even though an affirmative answer would be rather significant, which no doubt explains why so many luminaries, past and present, have addressed it. Despite the peculiar dismissal of the traditional question, Hershovitz offers, among other things, an interesting account of how legal prohibitions on otherwise immoral conduct nonetheless are morally important because they give the state standing to prosecute crimes (122–127).

I did, however, find Hershovitz’s use of (morally) “wrong” in this chapter somewhat confusing. He says, for example, that if “I owe you $500. . .I would wrong you if I don’t [pay you]” even if “I need the money to pay for my child’s medical care” (121), although he says wronging you would be the right thing to do. But you would not be justified in blaming me, given that my child’s health is more important than the debt, and, indeed, you could blame me for not attending to my child’s health if I paid off the debt instead. Not all harms are wrongs. The difficulty here, I suspect, is that “wrong” does not have a lot of cognitive content, and that many of Hershovitz’s judgments on particular cases are more ethnographic data about the etiquette norms of his class and milieu than philosophical insights. But Hershovitz is a moral realist,[5] and so takes his moral feelings quite seriously.

Chapter 6 argues “that the rule of law requires a shared moral outlook. Officials and (to a lesser extent) laypeople must see legal practices as sources of morality” (147–8). The “rule of law” is glossed in terms of Lon Fuller’s principles of legality (143) and the idea that political power is constrained by public norms and procedures (142). The shared “moral outlook” recognizes that efficacious legal institutions (which the rule of law makes possible) can generate moral obligations by facilitating coordination, resolving disputes peacefully, giving voice to everyone, and so on (144, a theme taken up in earlier chapters as well, but without a clear theory of when this is true).

Hershovitz purports to illustrate the latter with a story of how Alabama legal officials removed former Alabama Supreme Court Justice Roy Moore from office for failing to abide by the decisions of the federal courts on matters of federal constitutional law. Hershovitz makes the fanciful claim that they did this because Alabama legal officials shared the preceding “moral outlook” (143). What actually happened—namely, Alabama legal officials sanctioned a judge for breaching his clear legal duty by defying the order of a federal court over which it had jurisdiction—is dismissed by Hershovitz as merely the “official reason” (138) for his removal. Hershovitz, hell bent on moralizing every legal decision, notes that the “official reason” also mentioned that Moore “sought legal redress by appealing to the limit of judicial review; he was bound by, and had the duty to follow, the rulings of the federal courts” (138). Hershovitz adds that this “is a moral claim every bit as much as it is a legal one” (138). It could be construed as a moral claim, of course, but there is no evidence that is how Alabama officials thought about it. One could ask: is there a good moral reason for Alabama to insist that judges honor their legal obligations? But Hershovitz, in keeping with the trivial reading discussed at the start, simply insists the legal questions are moral ones.[6]

Chapter 7 defends the view that lawyers are “moral experts.” Given the preceding, this seems mostly unsurprising: if “law is a moral practice,” after all, and lawyers are legal experts, then they are moral experts. Once again, the trivial reading of “law is a moral practice” is doing all the work. Hershovitz starts by explaining how moral philosophers can be moral experts despite their disagreements. He cautions that “we should be careful not to exaggerate the extent of the disagreement” (152), which he then proceeds to wildly understate (cf. Leiter 2021 for the contrasting view). We can put that aside. More oddly, given Hershovitz’s moral realism, he invokes a 1972 defense of moral expertise by Peter Singer (then a moral anti-realist), according to which moral experts are good at collecting all the facts and then drawing valid inferences from them given “whatever moral view” one holds (154). One might have hoped moral experts also know which moral view is true! This discussion was quite superficial.

Hershovitz then turns to the question of whether lawyers are “assholes,” although the real issue is whether the existence of morally bad or indifferent lawyers is compatible with the thesis that “law is a moral practice.” Of course it is compatible, since his actual thesis is that any deontic talk in law can be recast in moral terms. He concludes by suggesting that “We ought to invite lawyers to see law as a moral practice—to see themselves as part of a moral endeavor” (167). As Herlinde Pauer-Studer (2020: 205) reminds us, the notorious Nazi judge Roland Freisler would have agreed: “There can be no divide between a requirement of law and a requirement of morality. For requirements of law are requirements of decency.” This does not show Hershovitz is wrong, but it does suggest that speculating about how a thesis about the nature of law will affect practice is a fool’s errand. (Hart did not, contrary to Hershovitz's presentation, rest his defense of legal positivism on any such speculation; he touched on the topic only in response to Fuller’s opposite speculation.)

Hershovitz’s authorial voice is conversational and inviting, and his writing is often clever and funny. I suspect this will make the book effective with readers who know little about general jurisprudence or its history.[7] Hershovitz professes to wanting to avoid “clutter,” but serious scholarship (including in jurisprudence: e.g., Kelsen, Hart, Raz) often involves “clutter,” i.e., acknowledging the history of a problem, the positions and distinctions others have thought important, the reasons for them, and the arguments against them. This book does almost none of that, so it cannot be recommended to anyone new to the subject, who will simply be left in the dark about the actual questions and problems in general jurisprudence. Despite Hershovitz’s professed interest in discouraging readers from “dig[ging] in and cheer[ing] for a team” (15), Hershovitz is very clearly on a team: anti-positivist, Dworkinian, and moral realist. The book is an amusing, meandering sketch of what seem to me implausible views, with too little serious argument, and too little effort to consider objections, even obvious ones, from the other “teams.”


I am grateful to Elena Di Rosa, Alma Diamond, Josh Kaufman, Richard Stillman, and Helen Zhao for illuminating and incisive discussion of the Hershovitz book in a reading group at the University of Chicago Law School during the 2024 Winter and Spring quarters; many of their excellent insights influenced this review, although none should be supposed to agree with it! I also thank Emad Atiq and Nina Varsava for comments on the penultimate draft.


Greenberg, Mark. 2004. “How Facts Make Law,” Legal Theory 10: 157–198.

Leiter, Brian. 2011. “The Demarcation Problem in Jurisprudence: A New Case for Skepticism,” Oxford Journal of Legal Studies 31: 663–677.

-----. 2015. “Constitutional Law, Moral Judgment, and the Supreme Court as Super-Legislature,” Hastings Law Journal 66: 1601–1615.

----. 2021. “Disagreement, Anti-Realism about Reasons, and Inference to the Best Explanation,” Ethical Theory & Moral Practice:

-----. Forthcoming. “The Metaphysical Turn in Recent American Jurisprudence,” in Leiter, From a Realist Point of View (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Pauer-Studer, Herlinde. 2020. Justifying Injustice: Legal Theory in Nazi Germany (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

[1] Another possibility (suggested by Hershovitz’s discussion of promising at 28) is that he thinks that legal practices, by their nature (as it were), aim to change people’s moral relationships, regardless of the actual practice and intentions. Some recent legal philosophers, like Mark Greenberg and Mark Murphy, do hold something like this view, although only Murphy has an argument for it. Hershovitz offers no argument for it, so I suspect it is not what he means. Even later (186), he suggests his view is “that we see our legal practices as (in part) efforts to adjust what we [morally] owe each other.” Anyone could take that approach, so it would tell us nothing about the nature of law or legal reasoning. This seems less “Law is a moral practice” than “let’s view law as if it were a moral practice.”

[2] This idiosyncratic formulation comes from Mark Greenberg (2004), but Greenberg speaks of the “existence and content” of law. Hershovitz’s truncation is striking. In the 20th century, the positivist thesis concerned the existence question (when does a norm exist as a norm of the legal system, i.e., when is it valid); Raz added the question of how content is determined, and Greenberg runs with that. On the general problems with this framing, see Leiter (forthcoming).

[3] What officials accept as authoritative are criteria of legal validity that tell us which norms are part of the law, but particular judges can be mistaken about the application of these criteria and thus deem norms legally valid that are not so. Hershovitz’s evidence against Hart’s view is supposed to be how courts talk in hard cases (a Dworkinian move, that is hardly decisive for a theory of law) and a faculty lounge conversation among his law colleagues about whether Trump could pardon himself (89–93).

[4] My own view (Leiter 2011) is that the best answer to the question “What is law?”—Hart’s answer—invariably yields fuzzy borderline cases, especially in the highest appellate courts, and it is a mistake to think that eliminating the “fuzz” in those cases is relevant to the question we are really concerned about: namely, what ought the court do? My sense is Hershovitz thinks we should only be asking, all the time, “What ought the court do?” with the past decisions of legal institutions being relevant only to the extent they affect our moral reasoning, as past events sometimes do. This would be the end of the legal system as we know it, of course.

[5] Hershovitz’s occasional comments on moral anti-realism are silly and superficial (e.g., 24, 194–195): “I have met people who acted as if they did not owe anything to others. But I have never met anyone who acted as if she wasn’t owed anything by others” (194). Nothing in moral anti-realism requires one not to have attitudes about obligations (to others or oneself); it just denies their objectivity. He also claims, bizarrely, that if you are “skeptical about moral claims, you should be skeptical about legal claims” (id.) even though the latter are, on a positivist view, just certain kinds of institutional or social facts: skepticism about moral reality does not entail skepticism about social reality.

[6] At the end of the book (192–194), Hershovitz allows that one could deny that “legal” rights/duties are just “moral” rights/duties and admits that he has “not argued against” this possibility, “at least not directly” (193). Since this is probably the central question raised by his book, this is a remarkable admission. Hershovitz claims that treating moral and legal duties as distinct is “needlessly complicated” (193), although I would have thought his book was evidence of needless complication both metaphysically (he needs moral realism), and conceptually (e.g., he goes to great length, in two different chapters, to explain how it is that bad laws can nonetheless produce moral obligations, although he never offers a general theory of when this is so).

[7] Most of the dust jacket blurbs fall into that category; the exceptions are a diehard Dworkinian, as well as a former colleague, friend, and mentor.