Law, Virtue and Justice

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Amalia Amaya and Ho Hock Lai (eds.), Law, Virtue and Justice, Hart Publishing, 2012, 336pp., $124.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781849461757.

Reviewed by Mark Tebbit, University of Reading/University of Notre Dame (London Centre)


One of the fears articulated and responded to again and again in this book is that virtue jurisprudence is dangerously subjective and as such threatens to undermine the rule of law. The same has been said over the last century about all the related ethical and legal movements and theories, from American legal realism to the revival of equity-based natural law and the emergence of radical race and feminist theories, which have challenged the mainstream. The rule of law is a defining value of a democratic society and is widely held to be a necessary condition for the preservation of our liberties. This ideal has several meanings, but the crucial one in this context is that respect for the law as it has evolved should act as a brake curbing the arbitrary willfulness of lawmakers, judges and officials at every level of the law. In a democracy, we like to believe that we live 'under the rule of law, not men'.

It is this fear of subjectivisation that the opening article by Claudio Michelon seeks to allay in his sympathetic account of the impact of virtue theory on legal reasoning and decision making. His aim is to persuade us that this impact is such as to present no threat of the kind imagined. His argument is ingenious. Drawing extensively on Aquinas's four inner senses and Wittgenstein's aspect-seeing and forms of life, he contends that it is only a Cartesian conception of an inscrutable inner subjectivity that actually does threaten the rule of law with a subjectivisation that would lead to the arbitrary 'rule of men'. Such rule 'strikes so much horror' into political philosophers and citizens when the mind is understood like this, because the very idea of it destroys empathy and trust. It is precisely this conception of subjectivity that virtue theory seeks to break down.

Focusing on the key Aristotelian intellectual virtue of practical wisdom (phronesis) as a necessary condition for good legal decision making, Michelon argues that we can avoid the narrow vision and perceptual rigidity exhibited by Langdell-style formalism and contemporary positivism, by cultivating the kind of subjectivity in legislators and judges that can be understood as relational. Such subjectivity will embody a bundle of faculties, skills and empathetic forms of perception that engage with the world, in contrast to the enclosed subjectivity which it is rightly feared will undermine the consistency and steadiness of purpose exhibited by a proper respect for settled law. The Aristotelian mode of subjectivity should be seen as not only compatible with the ideal of the rule of law, but also as a necessary condition for good legal decision-making. In other words, setting virtue theory in the context of a realistic theory of subjectivity changes the whole jurisprudential landscape.

This is followed by a vigorous and more concrete defence of virtue theory by Amalia Amaya. In an attempt to bring jurisprudence into line with recent trends in ethics and epistemology, she promotes the idea of justifying legal decisions in terms of virtues rather than rules or consequences. Her strategy is to argue for the strongest version of aretaic (virtue) theory, which rejects the compromise position of advocating a combined theory of justification, which would supplement rule or consequence-based theories with the insights of virtue theory. Instead, she proposes the counterfactual theory that a legal decision is justified if and only if a virtuous decision-maker -- a judge displaying all the right intellectual virtues -- would have taken it. Again, this is based on an Aristotelian conception of practical reason, which seeks to break up the domination of the field by utilitarian and deontological theories. In proposing the strongest version, that virtue is the condition of justification, Amaya rejects the weaker views that virtues play an auxiliary role in justification, or that what virtuous judges do is merely the criterion for what is legally justified. Her strong version is that virtue plays a constitutive role, that to say of a decision that it is justified is precisely to say that it is the decision a virtuous judge would have taken.

One striking implication of this is that it would justify a decision taken by a violently prejudiced judge, if it happened to be the right one. The example she gives is that of one judge applying all the intellectual virtues and finding a defendant guilty of murder, while another judge who displays none of these virtues reaches the same verdict. On her counterfactual theory, both decisions are equally justified. Other versions of virtue theory would disagree, as would many other non-virtue theories. Amaya raises and counters some of the most prominent criticisms of this whole approach to justification, the most common of which is that it is anachronistic to apply a theory that is more suited to the political and social conditions of Ancient Greece or the Middle Ages, and that is not applicable to modern societies, in which we have competing conceptions of political morality and no shared ideals of what virtue requires. Her answers to these objections are systematic and plausible, but the doubts will certainly persist.

The question at the heart of the dispute in the sections on criminal law is whether or not the proposed shift to virtue jurisprudence can offer anything more than peripheral insights into an area which is so manifestly rule-bound. One of the key claims of virtue theory here is that it offers a unique perspective on the determination of criminal fault and liability for punishment. The vices and virtues under the microscope in this respect are those of the defendant. The basic problem with this is identified by the critical reaction that the kind of mental states relevant to the assessment of guilty mind (mens rea) are not susceptible to close enough examination to be determined with any fine-grained precision. Kyron Huigens attempts to demonstrate that this is not so, that the criminal law is not as rule-bound as it might seem, and that the generalisations of the criminal code tend anyway to be particularised by the judge or jury when assessing the practical reasoning of the defendant. Coupled with the claim that what is under examination is 'a wide array of motivating intentions', rather than a simple singular intention, this shows that broad evaluations of practical reasoning by defendants are commonplace. This does seem to blur the vital distinction between intention and motive, and as R.A. Duff in his commentary points out, motivations are relevant only to sentencing and mitigation, not to the reasoning towards a verdict. Despite his laudable objective of highlighting the injustice of convicting an aged mercy-killer of murder, Huigens does not seem to have established his case, that the virtue theory perspective brings a unique insight into these legal problems.

Ekow Yankah argues in a similar vein that virtue-jurisprudence 'better justifies and explains important parts of law', and that ignoring it is doing serious damage to any attempts to make progress on pressing legal issues. Of these, he concentrates on the devastating effects on vulnerable women of the continued criminalisation of American prostitution. Yankah argues convincingly that there are good reasons for decriminalisation, but rejects the liberal arguments against condemning what they think should be seen non-judgementally as the choice of alternative lifestyles. On the contrary, Yankah insists, we should start by acknowledging that prostitution is, in terms of Aristotelian virtue, 'a moral wrong that retards virtue in a person' and is thereby a form of self-inflicted moral harm. We should then accept that decriminalising an activity is not equivalent to morally condoning it. Citing Aristotle's virtuous lawgiver, whose principal concern is a flourishing society, and drawing an analogy with the end of alcohol prohibition in the USA, Yankah argues that the continued criminalisation of prostitution leaves women at the mercy of pimps, gangsters and violent clients, and encourages all the evils of human trafficking. The vice of prostitution is more damaging to the flourishing of a human society when prohibited than when it is tolerated and regulated. His central argument is that we can find a consensus among the leading moral traditions of Aristotle, Kant and Mill that while prostitution is held to be a serious departure from sound moral values, involving among other things self-harm, it is neither desirable nor justifiable to criminalise it.

It is not, however, at all clear that this entirely reasonable argument for the separation of law and morality in this sense, really does require the conceptual framework of virtue jurisprudence. The same conclusion could have been reached without reference to it at all, in terms of lesser evils. Yankah briefly cites Mill's argument for liberty and toleration, but surprisingly makes no reference to the findings of the British Wolfenden Report on prostitution in the 1950s in favour of decriminalisation. His own case for decriminalisation in the USA today could easily be made within a consequentialist framework such as that of Wolfenden, Mill and Hart. So again, the feeling is that the claim that virtue jurisprudence is uniquely qualified to judge these issues does not seem to have been established.

At the heart of the collection of essays on aretaic fact-finding, we find a dispute between Ho Hock Lai and Frederick Schauer on how judges and juries do or should deliberate virtuously in reaching a criminal verdict. Schauer challenges what he sees as the uncritical coupling in recent years of virtue ethics with moral particularism, exemplified here by Hock Lai's application of it to a legal context. Both are in agreement about most of the substantial points raised by Hock Lai's article on the reasoning process, in which his main purpose is to identify and promote the virtues required for countering prejudice in deeply embedded racial and sexual stereotype generalisations. Using real examples effectively, he argues that the ethics of judicial deliberation inevitably involves discretion and judgement, which in turn involves justice as the empathetic recognition of the humanity of those one is judging. Unconscious prejudice is resisted and rooted out only by the cultivation of intellectual and moral virtues, and the recognition of one's own prejudices and frailties.

Schauer's criticism focuses on Hock Lai's illegitimate leap from the badness of stereotype generalisations to the wrongness of generalisations as such, resulting in an excessively radical theory of equitable interpretation, which would sweep away legal rules completely. As he points out, some rules are quite rightly applied mechanistically -- such as the rule that convicts the driver for recklessly driving at double the speed limit -- but Hock Lai's particularism would throw everything into question. It might indeed be feasible, he says, to argue for such an approach, but to suggest that this is the way the law already is, is to by-pass and pre-judge one of the most deeply contested issues of legal theory since Aristotle. There is much of value in each of these contributions, but Schauer's concluding comments on the difference between rule-fetishism and the judge who shows a proper sense of humility and modesty in sometimes seeing reason to apply the rules as they stand, even when her inclinations point in another direction, is hard to answer.

In the last group of essays the arguments revolve around the question at the heart of the Enlightenment conflict between the followers of Hume and Kant, that of whether our capacity to distinguish virtue from vice is ultimately derived from feeling or reason. What moves to centre stage here is the somewhat elusive concept of empathy and the role it should play in the law. Michael Slote wants not only to stress its importance to legal justice, but also to put the case for empathy as the central concept in an ethics of care, already developing in the writings of Carol Gilligan and of Slote himself.  He promote empathy as a sufficient basis for sustaining a comprehensive theory of justice and challenging the basis of the Kant-Rawls response to utilitarianism. Some of the most interesting features of Slote's debate here with John Deigh and Susan Brison lie in their close analysis of the concept of empathy itself -- relatively new in the English language -- discussing and disputing its connotations, and how it relates to the sentimentalist ethics of Hume and the rationalism of the Kantians.

Slote sees the liberal rationalist tradition, with its exclusive focus upon the rational autonomy of the individual, as having effectively eliminated empathy. This is vigorously contested by Deigh, who points to the distinction between a Kantian cognitive empathy -- a state of awareness of another person -- and empathy as an affective response to another person. It is by interpreting it in exclusively affective terms that Slote is able to elide empathy from the liberal Kantian tradition, when it is in fact indispensable to the understanding of legal justice and injustice. Deigh illustrates this effectively with the lack of cognitive empathy displayed by a recent Supreme Court decision. Slote responds by denying that the cognitive-affective distinction can be drawn so clearly. This is the central issue in this debate, but it draws in a much wider range of issues, relating to their respective interpretations of Hume's ethics and the subjectivism and emotivism that it is usually thought to give rise to, as well as many other political and legal issues relating to empathy. For Slote, the issue of the right to religious worship and indeed of all basic human rights is better understood in terms of empathy than of reason. Susan Brison's criticism of Slote endorses his view of the importance of empathy to justice, and accepts that it is perhaps a necessary condition for an adequate theory, but she remains sceptical -- as do I -- of the more ambitious claim that empathy alone can provide the basis for a full understanding of legal and social injustice. Empathy, she suggests, reasonably enough, has to be 'modified, tempered or disciplined with reason or some other moral measure'.

As a collection, this is a highly informative, always interesting and richly diversified body of research, engaged with vital questions especially of criminal law, but also of many other areas in ethics and law, including client confidentiality, legal moralism and paternalism. It also includes an instructive comparison between western and Confucian theories in this area of jurisprudence. Many concrete issues and controversies are discussed and illustrated with real and imaginary cases, such as euthanasia, prostitution and racial and sex discrimination. Overall, whether one is convinced or not, the project of developing the case for virtue jurisprudence is well served by this book.