Laws 1 and 2

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Plato, Laws 1 and 2, Susan Sauvé Meyer (tr. and comm.), Oxford University Press, 2015, 361pp., $74.00 (hbk.), ISBN 9780199604081.

Reviewed by David J. Riesbeck, Rice University


Philosophical interest in Plato's Laws has recently seen a resurgence following a long period of relative neglect. The works of André Laks and Christopher Bobonich, among others, have inspired philosophers of an analytic persuasion to take the Laws more seriously in its own right, and the quantity and quality of scholarship have increased accordingly. Yet up to now, readers looking for a philosophically sensitive commentary on the work in English have had nowhere to turn. E.B. England's 1921 commentary remains serviceable for those concerned with philological matters, and Klaus Schöpsdau's recently completed multi-volume commentary is a boon for scholars who read German. Readers looking for a more concise but sophisticated treatment, however, have so far been able to find it only in Robert Mayhew's commentary on Book X. Susan Sauvé Meyer has begun to fill this lacuna with her excellent volume on Books I-II, a work that will put all serious students of the Laws into her considerable debt. It should also lead us to look forward eagerly to her continuation of the project in a future volume on Books III-V.

Laws I-II set the stage for the entire dialogue and lay out some of the programmatic principles and concerns that guide the discussion of the remaining ten books. Three old men, the Cretan Clinias, the Spartan Megillus, and an anonymous Athenian, find themselves together on Crete journeying toward the cave of Zeus, the site where, according to Cretan myth, Minos, the son of Zeus, received the laws that he laid down for the Cretan cities. The Athenian, with an inquisitive loquacity befitting his civic origins, strikes up a conversation about this myth and the similar story that the Spartan Lycurgus received the laws of Sparta from the god Apollo. What begins as an amiable way to pass the time on their long summer trek quickly transforms into a critical dialectical investigation of the adequacy of the Spartan and Cretan laws. The Athenian's verdict is carefully hedged but decidedly negative: though his companions' cities rightly take virtue as the aim of law, they aim only at one part of virtue -- courage -- and operate with a badly mistaken conception of its nature and value. This critical exchange leads to a more general consideration of how a city's laws and institutions ought to be designed to educate its citizens to cultivate the whole of virtue properly understood.

Naturally enough, a satisfactory answer to this question requires an adequate grasp of what virtue is and how it is good, especially relative to other goods such as wealth, health, honor, power, pleasure, and the rest. The Athenian's view of these matters, at times sharply opposed to his interlocutors' intuitions, rests in part on a subtle theory of human psychology, and in particular on the relationship between the rational and non-rational elements of the human soul. He puts this theory to work not only in his treatment of the nature and value of virtue, but in a complex and fascinating treatment of education and its institutional embodiment. An educated person is one whose non-rational elements have been trained to take pleasure and pain in the right things and to be responsive to reason. The institutional means of developing and maintaining this condition are, primarily, the choral performance of music and poetry for the young and -- most startling to Clinias, Megillus, and not a few modern readers -- appropriately supervised drunkenness for the mature.

Laws I-II, then, though merely a prelude to the major task of the dialogue -- developing a system of laws for a new colony that, we learn in Book III, Clinias has been chosen to design -- discuss fundamental issues in ethics, politics, psychology, and their practical intersection in the design of educational institutions. These topics have been at the forefront of much recent scholarship, and Meyer appropriately focuses on them while keeping an eye on other aspects of the text that might puzzle or interest the user of a commentary. In what follows, I will describe what I see as the most salient strengths of the work, note a few features that some readers may find unsatisfying, and briefly consider the merits of one of her most distinctive interpretive claims.

Meyer provides us with an introduction and translation as well as a commentary, and each should be useful to experienced scholars of the Laws as well as newcomers to the text. Her concise introduction does two things particularly well. First, it provides a brief but informative overview of the whole dialogue and its structure; this is especially helpful given that the extreme length and sometimes confusing organization of the work are often a stumbling block to readers. Second, Meyer provides a detailed analytical outline of Books I-II, which not only succeeds in showing that these books, at least, are in fact carefully and lucidly organized, but also should help readers locate passages of particular interest and identify connections between them. This kind of work is often underappreciated, but readers seeking some basic orientation to these books and their place in the Laws will find no better introductory guide.

Meyer's goal for the translation is to find the mean between the sometimes unintelligible hyper-literalism of Thomas Pangle and the readable but all too often imprecise rendering of Trevor Saunders (vii-viii). For the most part she succeeds in this goal; she is typically more accurate and less misleading than Saunders and always more readable than Pangle. At times, however, her idiomatic and even eloquent English inevitably obscures important nuances in the Greek. The most notable case is her handling of the Greek kalon and related terms, famously perhaps the most difficult word to translate into English consistently without generating awkward or puzzling locutions. Translators variously prefer "beautiful," "noble," "admirable," "fine," and other alternatives, none of which alone is capable of expressing the appropriate sense and connotations in every context. Meyer elects to translate the word differently in different contexts, and while her renderings usually seem appropriate to the passage at hand, the result hides the important fact that Plato uses the same word in all these contexts. Scholars disagree about whether we should regard the word as bearing different senses in these contexts or as bearing a single sense for which English has no single word. However we come down on that question, any translation that alternates its renderings of kalon will obscure the connections that Plato expects his readers to see. Whether this is preferable to the bizarre and artificial expressions that result from a policy of rendering the word consistently is perhaps a matter of taste, but the problem is difficult to surmount.

Fortunately, however, Meyer's commentary dissolves this and similar problems with the translation. She not only comments extensively and insightfully on kalon (103-4) and other words that are difficult to render consistently, but regularly provides more literal alternative translations that highlight nuances and ambiguities that virtually no single translation could capture. Her discussion of linguistic issues will be thoroughly accessible to Greekless readers, but even highly trained classicists will appreciate her assistance with the sometimes torturous Greek of the Laws. Yet Meyer never descends to the level of philological details that bear little direct relevance to Plato's philosophical arguments. On the contrary, even those who read the commentary straight through will not lose sight of the overall trajectory of the dialectic and the significance of particular passages within it. Just as importantly, readers who dip in to the commentary for help with some particular passage will be guided to earlier and later passages that illuminate it; those who want to use the commentary selectively will not miss important details simply because Meyer has already discussed them. The opposite is a common flaw in commentaries, and I cannot think of another so free from it as Meyer's.

Readers will be most interested, however, in the commentary's treatment of the most philosophically robust passages in Laws I-II, and here Meyer does not disappoint. She consistently subjects Plato's arguments to the kind of careful and sophisticated analysis that brings out their basic coherence and plausibility, and she situates them helpfully against the broader Platonic and Greek backgrounds that make them most readily intelligible. She devotes considerably less attention to assessing these arguments and theses than to fixing on the best interpretation of them, and while some readers might wish for more critical engagement, others will appreciate the effort to put us in the best position to assess them for ourselves rather than to wrangle with the commentator's contestable philosophical judgments and sympathies. But of course, no interpretation is entirely unaffected by the interpreter's judgment and interests, and Meyer's come out to some extent in her choice of emphasis and omission.

One particularly striking omission is Meyer's decision to give fairly little sustained attention to the relationship between the Laws and other dialogues, especially the Republic. Some will find this decision refreshing, as scholars have traditionally been perhaps excessively focused on the dialogue's relation to other works, a relation that we cannot hope to understand adequately unless we first understand what the Laws itself is up to. Even so, it is surprising to find such little discussion of the apparent shift in the Laws from a tripartite psychology -- prominent not only in the Republic but also in the Phaedrus and the Timaeus -- to a bipartite or, as Bobonich would have it, unified theory of the soul. Meyer does not ignore this issue (172-4), but she has rather less to say about it than one might expect given recent debates. In fact, Meyer generally opts not to summarize scholarly debates in detail or to adjudicate disputes. Specialists might miss some of this internal sparring, but I suspect most everyone else will not, especially since Meyer consistently makes readers aware of the debates and gives us the resources to explore them independently.

This is not to say, however, that Meyer is reluctant to present her own take on controversial issues. Far from it. One of the most conspicuous virtues of her approach to the Laws is that while it displays the rigor and clarity characteristic of the best work by analytically trained historians of philosophy, she is also acutely sensitive to the dramatic details of the dialogue and their potential significance. She frequently considers how the Athenian's formulations of key ideas might be shaped by the need to appeal to his interlocutors' intuitions in order to bring them on board or by his focus on the content of an education appropriate to citizens at earlier stages of development, in which the correct training of pleasure and pain takes precedence over philosophical precision. So, for example, the Athenian's formulations of what Bobonich has called the Dependency Thesis -- the thesis that nothing is good at all independently of virtue -- are, Meyer argues, better understood as imprecise statements of a principle central to education than as a precise philosophical thesis that admits of no qualifications (256-8). So too, she maintains that the conception of virtue that the Athenian elaborates with the famous image of human beings as "divine puppets" is not the conception that he ultimately endorses, but a dialectical maneuver that draws on Clinias' own view of virtue as self-mastery and victory over oneself only to replace it with the more adequate view of virtue as psychic harmony between reason and non-rational desire (178-82). Let us briefly consider the merits of this interpretation.

Meyer is by no means the first to note the difference between what she calls the "victory model" and the "agreement model" of virtue (161-3), but she draws a very sharp distinction between them and places great emphasis on it. For Meyer, it is a mistake to see the image of humans as puppets pulled about by iron cords of pleasure, pain, and anticipation and the "golden cord of calculation" as a key to the Athenian's vision of virtue. The puppet image instead illustrates Clinias' model of virtue on which the virtuous person succeeds in bringing about the victory of the better, rational aspect of himself over the inferior, non-rational aspect; the virtuous person successfully follows the golden cord in opposition to the iron cords. On the agreement model, by contrast, the virtuous person's desires, pleasures, and pains are not at variance with his reason in the first place; there is no victory to be won because there is no war to be fought, and virtue resembles a stable condition of peace rather than a hard fought victory. There is certainly an important difference here, but we might reasonably doubt whether it is so stark as Meyer would have it, and in particular whether the puppet image is primarily appropriate only to the victory model.

First, as Meyer notes, the Athenian never explicitly rejects the victory model as such, and he continues to employ it after he has illustrated its shortcomings and the superiority of the agreement model. Meyer sees the Athenian as deploying a deliberate dialectical strategy of "continuing to appeal to a paradigm for virtue that he has discredited, but his opponents accept" (162), but we might instead infer that the two models are not mutually exclusive, however wide of the mark Clinias' articulation of the victory model may be. Second, and crucially, the Athenian insists that the education of pleasure and pain is a lifelong affair. Virtue is not simply a harmonious agreement once attained, but a delicate achievement that must be retained by repeated cultivation of the non-rational aspects of the soul. This need for restoration of the harmony between the person's rational and non-rational aspects is central to the Athenian's defense of the role of drunkenness in the life of a well ordered city, as Meyer herself stresses (211-5, 326, cf. 168). Perhaps more than any other dialogue, the Laws emphasizes our lifelong susceptibility to psychic conflict and the need for diligence in maintaining the harmony we achieve. The victory model thus retains its application even to well educated, virtuous adults, provided that we see the true aim of victory as the achievement of harmonious agreement rather than violent suppression. So too, the puppet image is well designed to express this feature of our lives: however successful we are at following the golden cord of calculation, the iron cords remain liable to being pulled in contrary directions. For these reasons, the victory and agreement models do not seem so fundamentally opposed, and the puppet image seems to serve as an illustration of the Athenian's own view of human psychology and not merely as a dialectical device.

It is entirely to Meyer's credit, however, that her commentary provokes constructive disagreement about some of the most distinctive philosophical ideas of Laws I-II. In that respect, as in others, it does exactly what a philosophical commentary should. My brief discussion here does not adequately reflect the rich rewards to be had from engaging with it. Anyone with an interest in Plato would be well served to spend time with this book.


Bobonich, C. 2002. Plato's Utopia Recast: His Later Ethics and Politics. Oxford University Press.

England, E.B. 1921. The Laws of Plato, the Text edited with Introduction and Notes, etc. Longmans, Green, and Co. and University of Manchester Press.

Laks, A. 2005. Médiation et coercition: Pour une lecture des Lois de Platon. Presses Universitaires du Septentrion.

Mayhew, R. 2008. Plato: Laws 10. Oxford University Press.

Pangle, T. 1980. The Laws of Plato, translated with Notes and an Interpretive Essay. University of Chicago Press.

Saunders, T. 1975. Plato: The Laws, translated with an Introduction. Penguin Books.

Schöpsdau, K. 1994. Platon: Nomoi (Gesetze): Buch I-III. Übersetzung und Kommentar. Vandenhoek und Ruprecht.

Schöpsdau, K. 2003. Platon: Nomoi (Gesetze): Buch IV-VII. Übersetzung und Kommentar. Vandenhoek und Ruprecht.

Schöpsdau, K. 2011. Platon: Nomoi (Gesetze): Buch VIII-XII. Übersetzung und Kommentar. Vandenhoek und Ruprecht.