Laws and Explanations: Theories and Modal Possibilities

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Arnold Koslow, Laws and Explanations: Theories and Modal Possibilities, Springer, 2019, 185pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783030188450.

Reviewed by Chris Dorst, University of Florida


This book consists of two parts. Part I critiques some famous accounts of laws, followed by a "mini-theory" connecting laws, accidents, and explanations. Part II explores the structures of various sorts of physical theories, and the possibilities that laws delimit therein.

Both Parts contain an eclectic mixture of ideas, exploring and amending historical theories, and using them to inform novel proposals. A compelling feature of the book is Arnold Koslow's ability to apply these historical ideas in new contexts. In his hand's, Ramsey's criticism of Russellian propositional functions turns into a fascinating argument against Armstrong's theory of laws, and Hilbert's conception of mathematical theories leads to the suggestion that Newton's second law is merely schematic, and therefore neither true nor false. Watching Koslow weave these disparate threads together is most intriguing.

In this review I'll first give a brief summary of each chapters, commenting along the way on a few points of note. I'll end with some more general thoughts about the book as a whole.

Following the Introduction, Chapter 2 kicks off with a discussion of the account of laws employed in Hempel and Oppenheim's seminal paper on the logic of scientific explanation, in which they aimed to use the notion of law to explicate that of explanation. The function of laws in their deductive nomological model is to allow a derivation of the explanandum fact, say Ga, from some particular condition, Fa. As Koslow notes, they chose the logically weakest candidate to play that role, i.e., the universally quantified conditional (x) (Fx → Gx), and he explores what would have happened if they had chosen something stronger, e.g., the universally quantified counterfactual (x) (Fx 🗆→ Gx). The verdict: expressing laws as counterfactuals would invalidate certain forms of reasoning that scientists commonly employ with laws.

Chapter 3 considers the claim that laws imply their corresponding counterfactuals. The "corresponding counterfactual" to a law of conditional form is just the counterfactual version of that conditional. But there are two readings of the claim that "laws imply their corresponding counterfactuals." One is that if a conditional statement A is a law, then A implies its corresponding counterfactual. The other is that the statement "A is a law" implies A's corresponding counterfactual. Koslow shows that the first proposal implies that laws are equivalent to counterfactuals, which he argued against in Chapter 2. The second proposal, he thinks, is more promising.

Chapter 4 considers Dretske's anti-Humean conception of laws as relations between physical properties. While Dretske framed his account as a radical break from the Humean orthodoxy, Koslow's subversive aim here is to show that Dretske's account is not really all that different from the Humean views he rejects. For instance, Dretske claims that laws are singular statements, as opposed to the Humean's universal generalizations. But Koslow suggests that this difference does not amount to much. Take the universal generalization (x) (Fx → Gx). Name the set of everything in F's extension "F*", and likewise for G. Then "F* ⊆ G*" is a singular statement (a statement about singular entities) that is nevertheless equivalent to the universal generalization. So the difference between singular statements and generalizations is a shallow one.

Chapter 5 is a sort of prelude to Chapter 6, but at first feels like a detour. Its concern is a debate in 19th-century mathematics about the notion of a function, and whether it ought to be defined extensionally or non-extensionally. The older non-extensional conception of functions turned out to be overly restrictive, and much progress in mathematics and physics has hinged on adopting the more permissive extensional conception.[1] It turns out that Russell and Whitehead's propositional functions in Principia Mathematica were non-extensional, and Ramsey thought that this was problematic because, he argued, it would prohibit them from expressing the relation of identity.

Chapter 6 leverages this Ramseyan argument into an impressive objection to Armstrong's theory of laws as relations between universals. Koslow shows how to define a state-of-affairs function (SAF) for any universal, which maps any particular to the possible state of affairs where that particular instantiates that universal. And it turns out that these SAFs are going to be non-extensional on the set of all states of affairs, implying (via a version of Ramsey's argument) that we cannot use them to define an identity relation between particulars in the natural way, namely by saying that two particulars are identical if they instantiate the exact same universals. This is taken as a damning criticism, since many scientific laws involve functions, and functions are relations that require a notion of identity.

Chapter 7 introduces what Koslow calls a "mini-theory" of laws and accidental generalizations, which he dubs "LAG." The mini-theory reverses the traditional order of priority: explanation is taken as a determinant of lawhood, rather than vice versa. It amounts to two claims:

  1. "It is a law that S" entails there is some theory that provides an explanation of all the instances of S.
  2. "It is an accident that S" entails that there is no one theory that provides an explanation for all the instances of S.

One might worry here about (2) -- can't we always just cook up some ad hoc theory that explains the instances of S? No: explanation is here taken to be factive in both the explanans and explanandum positions, so the fact that some theory T explains S entails that T is true. Koslow shows that accepting (1) and (2) allows us to derive some plausible consequences: (i) no law is an accident, (ii) law contexts are non-extensional, (iii) all laws are true, and (iv) if a generalization has an explanation, then it is not an accident.[2]

Another potential area of concern is what clause (2) would imply about a "theory of everything." Supposing we discovered such a theory, would it show that nothing is an accident? Or would such a theory fail to explain the instances of accidental regularities, since these explanations would require reference to initial conditions that are not properly part of the theory? Not enough is said here about either (a) the nature of explanation or (b) the nature of theories to evaluate this sort of claim. Of course, Koslow admits that this mini-theory is only "part of the full story" (p. 86), so perhaps it is unfair to require that it answer this sort of question.

Part II begins with Chapter 8. It provides a background review of theories that distinguish laws based on the role they play within a larger deductive system. The focus here is on how such an approach would handle the explanation of laws themselves, either by appealing to a more general claim within that same theory, or to a more general theory altogether. A subsequent review of Ernest Nagel's (1961) account of the structure of scientific theories leads to the suggestion that some theories might be schematic, meaning that they employ uninterpreted formalism and therefore lack a truth value.

Chapter 9 continues this thread by reviewing Hilbert's view of theories in both mathematics and physics. Koslow argues that we should likewise interpret Hilbertian theories as schematic. He then sketches an account of how we might view such theories as providing explanations* -- to be distinguished from genuine explanations because the would-be explanans lacks a truth value.

The remaining three chapters apply the ideas explored in 8 and 9. Chapters 10 and 11 develop a view of the basic structure of theories. Koslow suggests we think of a theory as positing a "Magnitude Vector Space" (MVS), which is essentially a vector space whose dimensions correspond to the fundamental magnitudes of the theory in question. Each vector in this space represents a "physical possibility," but not all physical possibilities are nomically possible. The role of the laws is then to restrict the set of physical possibilities to the set of nomic possibilities, i.e., the possibilities that are consistent with the laws.

The utility of this broad a notion of physical possibility may be questioned, however. Consider the case of Ohm's law, which Koslow himself discusses (p. 154). The law, V=IR, relates three magnitudes: voltage (V), current (I), and resistance (R). The MVS associated with this law is therefore a three-dimensional space, with one dimension for each magnitude. The law designates a subset of these vectors as nomic possibilities, namely the ones whose projections onto the voltage subspace have a length equal to the product of the lengths of their projections onto the current and resistance subspaces. Notice that the vast majority of vectors in this space will not be nomic possibilities, but will instead represent nomically impossible values for V, I, and R. One wonders, then, what the point is of countenancing these other vectors and designating them as "physical possibilities." There is a lot of surplus structure here that does not seem to be serving much purpose.

Chapter 12 shows how to apply both the idea of a Magnitude Vector Space and that of a schematic theory to some prominent physical theories, including Newtonian, Lagrangian, and Hamiltonian mechanics. Here Koslow makes the case that we ought to think of these theories as schematic, and shows how we can thereby think of them as explaining* their laws. For example, he suggests that Newton's Second Law, F=ma, is really a schematic statement, since in application we often replace the letter "F" with a distinct function determining the specific force in question -- e.g., the gravitational or Coulombic force.

This is suggestive, but the argument could use further support. The mere fact that we often replace "F" with, say, the function for gravitational force, does not necessarily imply that F=ma is really schematic and therefore lacks a truth value. All it shows is that F=ma has a certain level of generality. As an analogy, take the gravitational force law itself: F=(Gm1m2/r2), which Koslow takes to be non-schematic. In actual applications of this law, we replace m1, m2, and r2 with particular numerical values, but this, I take it, does not show that "F=(Gm1m2/r2)" is schematic. So something further is needed to demonstrate that F=ma is schematic as opposed to merely general.

I'll now turn to some general remarks about the book as a whole.

One thing that stood out to me is that while some theories receive extensive discussion and charitable amendments, others receive a more curt treatment. For example, in Chapter 2 Koslow briefly considers Lange's theory of laws. That theory makes central use of a principle called "Nomic Preservation":

NP: m is a law if and only if in any context, p 🗆→ m holds for any p that is logically consistent with all of the n's (taken together) where it is a law that n. (2009, p. 20)

Koslow has two brief objections to NP. First, it implies that any two laws are counterfactually equivalent. That is, if m and m* are both laws, then by NP it follows that m 🗆→ m* and m* 🗆→ m. Koslow claims that this "doesn't seem to be correct, either for any two laws of a theory (say the First and Second laws of Newtonian Mechanics), or laws from two different theories (say Genetics and Quantum-Electrodynamics)" (p. 28). But it is opaque to me what the worry is here. If m and m* are laws, then they are both true, so on standard accounts of counterfactuals both m 🗆→ m* and m* 🗆→ m will indeed come out true.

Koslow's second objection is that NP implies that the disjunction of any two laws is also a law. He is certainly right about this. Indeed, NP cannot separate laws from their logical consequences, so not only is the disjunction of any two laws going to count as a law, but so too is the disjunction of a law with any other claim at all. However, Lange himself explicitly notes this (ibid., p. 16), and suggests we think of his account as distinguishing those claims that hold purely "as a matter of law" from those that do not. So this objection seems to miss the mark.

Another theory given rather short shrift is Lewis's Best System Account, according to which laws are the regularities of the simplest and strongest deductive systematization of the totality of the particular matters of fact. Koslow's worry here is that if this account is right, we will never be able to know which statements are laws, presumably because we will never know all the particular matters of fact. However I take it that Lewis would respond as follows: we may indeed have enough evidence to conclude (indeed, to know) that some statement m expresses a law even if our evidence does not entail m's lawhood. And on reflection this seems like exactly the right result -- for in what conceivable situation would our scientific evidence ever be sufficient to entail the laws?

One point that I found refreshing is that the book says very little about the nature of explanation. Indeed, other than a few assumptions about its logical properties, almost nothing is assumed. This is certainly a break from the recent literature in philosophy of science, where theories of explanation have proliferated. And while it does have some drawbacks -- e.g., the difficulty of evaluating Chapter 7's LAG mini-theory -- it also makes the book's central theses unusually malleable (dare I say "schematic"?). Plug in whatever account of explanation you like: as long as it has the requisite logical properties, the same consequences will still follow.

As a whole, this book is filled with clever arguments and neat proofs, and the prose is replete with clear explanations that make for a relatively easy read. But its greatest strength lies in its ability to connect things that you would have thought had no connection. Looking over the chapters and reading the introduction, I several times found myself thinking, "How do these two things have anything to do with each other?" And yet Koslow repeatedly finds fascinating ways to relate them. The most enjoyable aspect of this book is something that it shares with classic adventure stories: the ability to craft a narrative that coherently links a wide variety of exotic places and ideas.


Thanks to Rob Smithson for helpful comments on an earlier draft.


Armstrong, D. (1983) What is a Law of Nature? Cambridge University Press.

Dretske, F. (1977) "Laws of Nature." Philosophy of Science, 44: 248-268.

Hempel, C. G. and Oppenheim, P. (1948) "Studies in the Logic of Explanation." Philosophy of Science, 15: 135-178.

Lange, M. (2009) Laws and Lawmakers. Oxford University Press.

Lewis, D. (1973) Counterfactuals. Harvard University Press.

Nagel, E. (1961) The Structure of Science. Harcourt, Brace & World.

[1] Roughly, the non-extensional conception of functions required the existence of a unified algebraic expression from which one could derive all the values of the function. (A piecewise function would not count as a "function" on this conception, because it derives its value from distinct algebraic expressions.) The newer extensional notion has no such requirement, and instead conceives of a function of n arguments merely as a set of ordered (n+1)-tuples.

[2] The derivations of consequences (iii) and (iv) require some extra assumptions about explanation.