Laws, Mind, and Free Will

Placeholder book cover

Steven Horst, Laws, Mind, and Free Will, MIT Press, 2011, 277pp., $36.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262015257.

Reviewed by Bernard Berofsky, Columbia University


Steven Horst has several goals in Laws, Mind, and Free Will. He defends a particular account of scientific laws and shows how this account has multiple significant implications, one of these being the repudiation of determinism in a way that secures the possibility of free will. He also produces a justification of psychological laws and an account of the difference between them and others, such as the laws of physics, which solve some vexing problems about mind emanating from Davidson's anomalous monism. In addition, Horst presents a view of the human mind as representing the world via diverse models that may not necessarily cohere with one another and are unlikely to be unified, a view he calls cognitive pluralism. Finally, in order to illustrate and vindicate his view of laws and models, he presents detailed developments within three major areas of the cognitive sciences.

This last project takes up the third part of the book and can be read independently. Horst produces a highly valuable and detailed account of major developments within visual psychophysics, theories of vision that implicate the visual cortex, and belief-desire psychology. His general conclusion is "that there are respectable models of the mind in the sciences of the mind that pick out real causal invariants in psychodynamics" (257). He makes three more specific claims. (1) There are laws to be found in all these areas of psychology and the difference between psychology and the physical sciences, therefore, is not that only physics is nomic. (2) A crucial difference between psychology and the physical sciences is that cortical systems display feedback so that parts of the brain cannot function normally without these relationships to other parts of the brain, whereas in physics, we hope to isolate systems from one another to formulate laws. (3) Although common sense psychology is not limited to belief-desire psychology (frame theory is an alternative) and although common sense generalizations that offer explanations of action in terms of beliefs and desires are not laws, the various regimentations of these explanations (for example, economic decision theory, psychoanalysis, computational theories of the mind) can take the form of models that approach the formal exactitude of scientific models.

There is no doubt that, in Part 3, Horst illustrates the doctrines he has earlier defended. For example, Horst notes that the loose, ceteris paribus generalizations of psychology that Davidson concentrated on are not the best that psychology can do. There are bona fide laws of psychophysics, such as Fechner's. And when we look at cortical dynamics, we discover a far more important distinction between physics and psychology than that of strict versus ceteris paribus. When we look at their systemic ideals, we find, as mentioned above, that physics posits as an ideal systems functioning in isolation from one another, whereas normal functioning in the brain involves interrelationships created by feedback mechanisms.

According to Horst, the demand for strict laws, a demand that psychology obviously cannot fulfill, derives from an underlying commitment to a mistaken model of laws as true, universally quantified generalizations. Without prejudice (at least for the moment) both to Horst's critique of this view, which he calls "empiricist," along with the replacement view he recommends, I have always wondered how the doctrine he rejects ever attained the traction it has in light of the obvious fact that most laws of physics are ceteris paribus! If there are strict laws in physics, they must be the basic or foundational laws. But the latter cannot do the work that they are required to do for the various doctrines that spin off the alleged distinction between physics and psychology. For example, under Davidson's anomalous monism, the physical description of mental events that he posits in the famous argument that concludes with the mind-body identity theory would have to be neurological and, therefore, not a part of the basic laws of physics.

Although Horst acknowledges compatibilist views on free will, he is clearly unsympathetic. If determinism is true, then no one could have acted otherwise. Any conception of free will under determinism would not capture essential components of human agency. Whatever argument there is for these positions is quite brief; Horst just defines "free will" as "libertarian free will." Since libertarian free will is, by definition, incompatible with determinism, we must choose, and Horst concludes that determinism is not much of a threat to (libertarian) free will. What is wrong with determinism?

To believe in determinism, one must believe that all events are governed by natural law. Now it is true that the abandonment of, or skepticism about, grand schemes such as those of Laplace and the adherents of Unified Science together with the success of theories like quantum mechanics and stochastic theories in the social sciences -- for example, certain learning theories -- have made most thinkers skeptical about determinism itself. This is well-known. So if one is going to evaluate determinism, as Horst does, one can repudiate traditional forms with relative ease; but the results will be unoriginal. Or, more charitably, one can consider the possibility of a deterministic outlook that abandons predictability in principle along with the ideal of the unification of the sciences. It is easy to be charitable for there are several accounts of determinism that have replaced the traditional component of predictability in principle with more metaphysical ideas, such as universal law governance or periodicity. With respect to unification, Horst himself is a critic of scientific unification, as the theory of cognitive pluralism -- with its multiple, partial models, and minds viewing the world in a piecemeal way -- dictates. To be sure, scientific determinism may have evolved from grand metaphysical outlooks like the principle of sufficient reason, theological determinism, or fatalism. But modern determinism can be formulated without these extravagances.

Thus, if someone is going to raise the free will issue and tell us more than that determinism is a dubious doctrine, she ought to give determinism a fighting chance. She must then confront determinism's reliance on the empiricist theory of laws.

The basic problem for the empiricist conception of laws, as Nancy Cartwright has dramatically recognized, is that, understood as universal material conditionals ranging over real objects and events, laws are false. One reason they are false -- interferences from outside the system -- is presumably addressed by the standard move of treating laws as ceteris paribus. They are then not falsified when other things are not equal. Moreover, the specification of stated limits in the form of boundary conditions limits the possibility of falsification. But there are also disputes as to the understanding and even intelligibility of the concept of ceteris paribus. Besides, the strategy is insufficient as it does not address the problem of causal interactions of independent processes. To use Cartwright's example, if there are laws governing the behavior of a substance when it is mixed with an acid, laws governing what it does when mixed with a base, and no possibility of using vector addition to determine what it does when mixed with both, then there are no laws that would enable us to predict the outcome of mixtures with an acid and a base.

But Horst concedes that we can experimentally determine the outcome and add the result to the "patchwork of laws." To be sure, in some cases of causal intersections, where more than one force is operative, we can, as Horst notes, calculate the resultant force via vector algebra. But sometimes one must just record experimentally what happens. Thus, to obtain the universal coverage demanded by determinism, why not just posit "superlaws," laws that govern the behavior of objects that are under the influence of multiple forces? There are regularities pertaining to causal interactions even if they are not the laws of any particular science.

Objections to superlaws cannot stem from an abhorrence to disunity for, as noted, unification of theories is unlikely on Horst's cognitive pluralism. The aversion seems rather to arise from the fact that they fall outside any model. But, in a "dappled" world (a Cartwright term of which Horst approves), why might we not find that there are such laws? Horst specifically rejects an interpretation of his cognitive pluralism as a Kantian position according to which we cannot view the world outside the lens of some model or another. Although we "may introduce artefacts of our own cognitive architecture into the model" (69), Horst allows forms of representation that are not models. And he ultimately concedes that, in certain cases "a model may not be available" (80), and we may need "a set of heuristics … 'kludges'" (80). So he does not in fact deny phenomenological laws, e.g., constitutive equations, in physics (without assuming that they may someday be embedded in physical theory)? Laws that fail in terms of scope or significance do not fail in terms of nomicity and there is, therefore, no case against a determinist who avails himself of superlaws in order to capture certain phenomena that cannot otherwise be captured under the deterministic net. Thus, Horst's statement, "Laws … present themselves within the context of enterprises of modeling" (65) is, at best, an idealization. Think about this issue from the perspective of an incompatibilist. Suppose, to account for someone's decisions, it is insufficient to cite the laws of genetics and the laws of development. We also needs laws that describe the interaction of the two. If a person is worried about determinism, why should he be less worried about this enhanced scenario?

Horst is, however, right that, in the end, the empirical case for determinism is weak and the prominence of indeterministic and nondeterministic theories makes the case even weaker, at least at the current stage of scientific knowledge.

Yet Horst fails to acknowledge a crucial consideration that, to my knowledge, has never been noticed by any philosopher addressing these issues, to wit, that abandonment of determinism does not dissolve the free will problem anyway. So long as the notion of a deterministic account can be given sense, one can worry whether a particular action or type of action was done of the agent's own free will when there is a deterministic account of it. Suppose that quantum mechanics is completely vindicated as an indeterministic theory, but one whose realm of indetermination does not reverberate to the macro level of decisions and actions. Suppose as well that Freudian psychoanalysis makes a dramatic comeback and that the most plausible interpretation of its doctrine is that "all our choices are completely governed by unconscious forces we cannot control," thereby vindicating the radical position of John Hospers (1958) that psychoanalysis renders freedom illusory. This is admittedly a farfetched scenario; but something like this would leave us with indeterminism and the absence of free will.

In fact, it is not clear that we cannot have psychological determinism (not necessarily of the Freudian variety) alongside physical determinism (perhaps at a level above the quantum level). Horst's rejection of this possibility -- causal compatibilism -- rests on a brief paragraph in which he assumes, but does not defend, the Exclusion Principle (108-109). Causal compatibilism has been defended by Terence Horgan (2001), Peter Menzies (2003), Cynthia and Graham Macdonald (2006), Stephen Yablo (1992), and Bernard Berofsky (2012), among others.

If the empiricist theory of laws fails, what does Horst offer in replacement? Some familiar alternatives, he notes, are problematic as well. If we treat laws as propositions about forces (the dynamic approach) -- or, more generally, capacities -- we need some way of linking them to real events, whose predictions often require reference to multiple forces. If, instead, we treat the domain of laws as models, since there are models of completely fanciful worlds, we again have to determine which models (and laws) apply to the real world. Presumably, according to Horst, recognition that laws are components of models (Chapter 7) is the key to understanding their nature and resolving these difficulties.

For example, a central problem confronting other approaches is the prediction problem. Laws can be fine explanations. But on the empiricist approach, when other things are not equal, a law may fail to predict accurately. And according to the dynamic theory, the presence of forces other than the one cited by the law might also thwart prediction. So one must recognize that models are sometimes partial and multipurposed, prediction being only one of those purposes. Hence, "there is a large and complicated gap between models and description or prediction" (81).

Horst's account is far more nuanced and consequently more realistic than the accounts of laws he rejects. But if laws as such are not required to produce detailed predictions, why is it a problem on the dynamic account that it often does not produce predictions? Horst does point out that, when we sees laws as parts of multipurposed models, we recognize that prediction is only one role of laws. But, as stated above, I find that the relation between laws and models is not as intimate as Horst makes out. Why can't we view the law of gravity as a law that does not always produce accurate predictions, but is a law about the force of gravity (the dynamic account)? Come to think of it, why can't one say the same about the empiricist account! We need a summation-of-forces equation for prediction when other things are not equal, but that fact undercuts the nomic status of empiricist laws only for one like Horst, who insists that this demand be met within the same model as the original law. How is this demand warranted in a dappled world like ours?

Although I have challenged some of Horst's key claims about free will and the nature of laws, I think that in this book his contribution to those who wish to understand the latest developments in various areas of psychology is highly valuable. And his detailed exposition of theories shows precisely how models work in psychology and vindicates to some extent the nuanced theory of models and laws developed earlier in the book.


Berofsky, B. (2012), Nature's Challenge to Free Will (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Horgan, T. (2001), 'Causal Compatibilism and the Exclusion Problem', in Theoria 40/1: 95-116.

Hospers, J. (1958), 'What Means This Freedom?', in S. Hook (ed.), Determinism and Freedom in the Age of Modern Science (New York: Collier-Macmillan), 126-42.

Macdonald, C., and Macdonald, G. (2006), 'The Metaphysics of Mental Causation', in Journal of Philosophy 103/11: 539-76.

Menzies, P. (2003), 'The Causal Efficacy of Mental States', in S. Walter, and H-D. Heckmann (eds.), Physicalism and Mental Causation: The Metaphysics of Mind and Action (Exeter: Imprint Academic), 195-223.

Yablo, S. (1992), 'Mental Causation', in Philosophical Review 101/2: 245-80.