Gerald Postema’s Law’s Rule provides a theory of the rule of law and addresses a number of challenges to the rule of law as a moral ideal. Those not familiar with philosophy of law might think that the rule of law consists merely in laws’ being generally followed and impartially enforced, thereby providing people with firm assurance about how others will behave, and thus a somewhat predictable social environment. Postema’s core idea is that the rule of law is instead a moral ideal that law provides protection and recourse against the arbitrary exercise of power. The book develops this core idea systematically, notes its conditions and limits, and discusses challenges to the rule of law. Nearly all the book’s arguments and explanations are clear, careful, and persuasive. This is a very valuable book.
From the core idea that the rule of law provides protection and recourse against the arbitrary exercise of power, Postema infers three principles, the first of which is that “all governing power is derived only from and is ordained exclusively by law” (19). The legitimate exercise of government power is underwritten and constrained by law (94, 116). In contrast with the idea that the law is merely whatever the ruler edicts or even merely wants, the rule of law incorporates Lon Fuller’s moral requirements that “ruling power take the form of public standards, articulated in general, prospective, consistent terms, accessible to all, underwriting claims of right that can be submitted to tribunals empowered to assess them with the participation of those subject to that power” (55).
The second principle that Postema infers from the core idea that the rule of law provides protection and recourse against the arbitrary exercise of power is the related idea that the law must apply to everyone in the polity. All are entitled to law’s protection. And all, even those in power, are bound by law’s constraints. The rule of law thus requires a kind of general equality of legal status.
The third principle inferred from the core idea is that the rule of law requires and depends upon people’s taking responsibility for holding one another to account under the law. This responsibility lies both upon those in official roles and upon those not in official roles.
A point Postema makes repeatedly and persuasively is that, while law extends to all members of the polity, in terms of their protections, their recourse to remedies, and their responsibilities for holding others to account, law need not be framed so as to invade every aspect of life. As he puts the point, “Law’s sovereignty does not entail law’s ubiquity” (59). “One need not publicly defend one’s choice of restaurant. . .even less one’s choice of hobby, career, employer, or mate, not to mention one’s decision to stop cancer treatment” (144).
Since Postema explains the rule of law in terms of its opposition to the arbitrary exercise of power, he needs to provide an account of the arbitrary exercise of power. The kind of power on which Postema mainly focuses is the power of agents to determine, or at least influence, the behavior of other agents. If I am dependent on you but you are not dependent on me, you might be able to influence my behavior while I cannot influence yours. Your influence on my behavior might not be personal or deliberate or even transparent to you. Your influence on my behavior might depend upon social, economic, or political structures. It might even be the case that you have the power to influence my behavior, and yet you never choose to exercise your power.
While I agree with Postema about those matters, I wonder whether it is a necessary condition of your having power over me that you have the capacity to determine or at least influence my behavior. Could you not exercise power over me by influencing my welfare even if not my behavior?
Postema warns that “it is no easy matter to say, for the purposes of the rule of law, what makes an exercise of power arbitrary” (29). His first gloss on the arbitrary exercise of power is that it is “capricious and arrogant” (29). The idea here is that nothing constrains arbitrary exercise of power except the will or choice of the wielder. However, such exercises of power need not be chaotic; they could be patterned and thus predictable. Imagine that there is some wielder of power who consistently pursues self-interest above all else. If she always exercises power so as to bring about the greatest expected benefit to herself, is it not objectionable because her exercises of power are utterly selfish rather than tarbitrary?
Postema’s second gloss on the arbitrary exercise of power is that it is unilateral: “The wielder’s perspective on the action is the only relevant deliberative perspective; no other side or perspective is considered” (29). But does the wielder’s exercise of arbitrary power over the subject of that power consist in the wielder’s ignoring the subject’s perspective? Suppose you assign a low grade to my essay. When doing so, you might well have ignored my perspective on the prospect of your assigning a low grade to my essay. Your ignoring my perspective on your action does not constitute an arbitrary exercise of power. What would constitute an arbitrary exercise of power would be for you to assign a grade to my essay without being accountable to anyone for the grade you assigned. Reasons for assigning my essay a low grade would point to properties of this essay, such as its lack of focus, unclarity, confusion, illogical argumentation, myopia, etc. If you were accountable to someone to pinpoint such properties in my essay, then your exercise of power in assigning my essay a low grade was not arbitrary.
But suppose you did apply criteria when evaluating my essay and you were able to report your criteria to others, but the criteria you applied where indefensible. Suppose, for example, you judged my essay purely in terms of how much it praised you and condemned your detractors. In this case, your exercise of power in assigning my essay a low grade was an abuse of power, because you used self-serving criteria where such criteria are utterly inappropriate. But is this abuse of power arbitrary? It seems that the abuse of power consists not in arbitrariness but in using inappropriate criteria. If things are as they seem here, then the question that needs answering is what makes criteria appropriate or inappropriate.
In many cases, we might be able to point to laws to determine which criteria are appropriate or inappropriate. The law in many countries now dictates that the sex of employees cannot justify differential pay. In such jurisdictions, if employers somehow get away with paying women less than men for the same work, then (although these employers might have saved their companies some money in wages) these employers have abused their capacity to affect the welfare of their female employees, even if they have not determined or influenced the behavior of their female employees.
These employers have definitely done wrong and abused their power. But the wrong does not seem best described as an arbitrary exercise of power. The wrong done seems rather to be that the employers distinguished among employees by sex when such a distinction was morally irrelevant.
In the example I just gave, drawing a distinction among employees based on sex was not only drawing a morally irrelevant distinction but also a distinction that is disallowed by current law. Yet Postema’s account of arbitrary exercise of power and abuse of power cannot explain such cases by referring solely to current law. For his line of argument is that the rule of law is a moral ideal that presses the law to be (re)configured so as to oppose the arbitrary exercise and abuse of power. Consider a time when current law didn’t prohibit paying men more than women although they were doing the same work. In Postema’s view, the rule of law would call for such a prohibition in order to oppose the arbitrary exercise and abuse of power. But in this case, the arbitrary exercise and abuse of power is best explained in terms of morality, not in terms of the law that was current (cf. 75).
Postema is clear that “We should think of law not as substitute for morality (and the Right) but rather as a needed complement to morality” (44). Even in a society of the morally conscientious, structures and institutions are needed to make people’s ideas about what is morally right public, and to work out disagreements (45). Moreover, moral rights are often indeterminate, for example concerning what the rights are to, who bears them, who has correlate obligations, and what the weights of these rights are. Law has an indispensable role to play in addressing such indeterminacies. Indeed, “our best hope that human rights will be respected and enjoyed lies in their being enshrined in legal institutions that meet the demands of the rule of law” (107).
This is not to deny that there can be conflicts between morality and the law. “Law, all too frequently, entrenches appalling injustice” (97). Indeed, “It is possible for a legal order to meet the formal and procedural conditions of the rule of law—generality, prospectivity, publicity, procedural due process, and the like—and yet systematically violate such [human] rights” (108). The moral ideal of the rule of law in only one part of political morality, and not always the most important part (132, 255).
And yet the moral backdrop of the ideal of the rule of law does push towards an overlap with democracy, rights, and justice. This moral backdrop is woven out of concern for dignity, relational equality, and freedom from subordination (ch. 4).
Dignity is a matter of moral status. “One whose dignity is respected can stand eye to eye with others in one’s community” (89). Dignity is a status that brings with it rights and responsibilities. Since “law provides the resources with which to articulate the interests and needs of members and the community in terms of rights that empower members to make claims upon those who exercise power”, Postema asserts, “law provides a means of honoring publicly the dignity of each member” (94). This dignity is something everyone shares in equally. At the most basic level, the rule of law insists that law must treat everyone with equal respect. The law itself must not subordinate some to others, nor allow to anyone arbitrary power over others.
Many fascinating implications of this vision are drawn out in this book. For example, Postema sets out the cases for an independent judiciary with the power to review legislation and executive decisions, for constraining executive power to grant pardons, for holding to the rule of law even during crises, for the law to require monitoring and regulating of the collection and sale of digital information, for rejecting the notion that artificial intelligence will be able to make defensible judicial decisions, and for holding that the rule of law has a legitimate and at least somewhat effective role to play when different countries try to influence one another. Postema also argues against the idea that civil disobedience and mercy are incompatible with the rule of law. In all these areas, the arguments Postema puts forward seem to me well judged and convincing.
Postema does not duck difficult topics. One difficult topic concerns the room the rule of law allows for equity. Consider a case in which straightforward application of the law would impose a disproportionate hardship on one of the parties. Or perhaps one of the parties has acted opportunistically and deceptively to exploit an unanticipated gap in legislation. If a judge appeals to equity in such a case to decide against the letter of the law, does the decision offend against the rule of law? Postema’s answer is that the rule of law ought to incorporate mechanisms of self-correction and that “a robust partnership with equity is one such mechanism of self-correction” (220).
Imagine a case in which one party is exploiting the letter of the law to gain power over another party. Postema’s idea is that the rule of law could licence the judge to appeal to equity in refusing to apply the letter of the law when applying the letter of the law would enable one party’s arbitrary exercise of power over the other party. But what would make such an exercise of power arbitrary? As the case is described, this exercise of power would be allowed by the letter of the law. So this exercise of power is not a legally arbitrary exercise of power. Presumably it is a morally arbitrary exercise of power. If so, then the idea is that the rule of law would call for equity to be appealed to in order to set aside the law where the law allows a morally arbitrary exercise of power.
I am not contending that Postema himself construed “arbitrary exercises of power” as “morally arbitrary exercises of power.” Nevertheless, I think that some of the conclusions he reaches are most charitably interpreted as relying on the idea that the core purpose of the rule of law is to oppose exercises of power that draw on morally indefensible distinctions.