Le moment républicain en France

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Jean-Fabien Spitz, Le moment républicain en France, Gallimard, 2005, 523pp., $35.00 (cloth), ISBN 2070775755.

Reviewed by Christian Nadeau, Université de Montréal


Jean-Fabien Spitz has significantly contributed to a renewed interest in republicanism. Alongside contemporaries such as Quentin Skinner, Sudhir Hazareesingh and Richard Whatmore, Spitz has endeavored to study classic republican texts in order to illuminate their contemporary relevance to the republican debate on liberty. Spitz not only explicitly references John Pocock's The Machiavellian Moment, but also intends to schematize a particular era's conception of political freedom and civic participation. His conception regards political liberalism more favorably than what one might expect, not only of a French republican theory, but most other republican conceptions. Through a historical approach to republicanism, he urges us to recognize the value of amending liberalism's notion of equality in favor of the republican conception of political equality.

Two obstacles obstruct Spitz's revision. First, a misapprehension of the fundamental principles of republican egalitarianism has led many to espouse a confused view of republicanism. Currently, republicanism is often viewed as a theory that is diametrically opposed to the individualism characteristic of liberal theories. Maurizio Viroli and Michael Sandel are two scholars who have made such critiques. Second, a degree of ignorance about the history of republicanism has inspired false presuppositions about republicanism. Spitz corrects the assumption that republicanism is a non-subjectivist theory of political freedom characterized by the view that the liberty of the community overrides the individual's liberty. On his view, republicanism need not and ought not deny the fundamental importance of individual rights. We also must not presume that republican theories necessarily place individual rights second in rank to concerns about solidarity or group emancipation. What ought to be prioritized is securing equality of opportunity, and not a view of equality in conflict with the plurality of moral views typical of modern-day democracies. This flawed interpretation of republicanism, that Spitz wants to correct, results from neglecting a facet of the history of republicanism during which equality of opportunity was emphasized and individual rights were not seen as conflicting with egalitarian ideals.

Spitz's work is subdivided into five independent sections. Although these sections are composed in such a way as to allow them to stand alone, they are united by a core theme that runs throughout. This common thread is the relation between equality and liberty within republican thought, placed within the larger context of the struggle between the discourses proper to natural science and political philosophy. His lengthy introduction lays the foundation for the philosophical debate by means of a discussion about the contribution of neo-republicanism to modern political theories. It is here that Spitz rejects the arguments of French thinkers such as Alain Renault and Pierre Rosanvallon, who have attempted to characterize the republican tradition as one that stands diametrically opposed to the novel contributions offered by liberal political thought. While Le moment républicain en France primarily targets a French audience, it proves important to denouncing prejudices heard as frequently outside French borders as on French soil. This is but one reason that an English translation ought to be eagerly welcomed.

In recent years, the most prominent debates within neo-republican literature have revolved around institutional design. The egalitarian ideal finds its place at the heart of these discussions. But what are the precise ramifications of egalitarianism on institutional design? In answering this question, Spitz shows how equality of opportunity is the best means of linking liberty and equality.

Jacques Furet and Mona Ozouf are two of the most renowned French historians to have defended the view that egalitarianism is associated with the Jacobin tradition, stemming from the French Revolution. According to them, republicanism supposedly endeavors to uphold a version of egalitarianism that eclipses individual preference as well as both cultural and social pluralism. French republicanism is then anti-modern in the sense that it constitutes a threat to the pluralism constitutive of present-day democracies. Spitz challenges this view, showing how it is not an accurate description of the end of the 19th century when the republican discourse reached maturity in France.

Spitz's exploration of the French republican tradition during the 19th century reveals similarities to Dworkin's own notion of the connection between the equality of rights and the equality of conditions in the way that it was thought that civil society and the state must unite in order to struggle against the dependence of the weak on the affluent and the powerful. The republican aim in France throughout the 19th century was to bring about material equality, education, and securing effective rights such as labor rights, and a minimal degree of financial security and health care. Equality of opportunity is predominant in the republican 19th century France, which is why progressive taxes and estate taxes ought to be instituted in order to prevent the unfair transmission of goods.

A presentation of Henry Michel's (1857-1904) thought occurs in the first section of Le moment républicain en France. In L'idée de L'Etat (1896), Michel defended the thesis that republicanism's project is not hostile to individualism. On his view, society is an amalgamation of moral points of view that the social order must regard as an enduring social condition that must be accepted rather than remedied. As Rousseau's disciple, Henry Michel viewed the freedom of the state as a prior condition to the freedom of individuals and, although the state was necessary to the freedom of individuals on his view, he prized individual liberty over the freedom of the State. The state therefore does not subordinate the individual; it is subordinate to him. Because the state ultimately wishes to maximize the moral autonomy of individuals and sees this autonomy as a supreme good, there is no true opposition between freedom and equality on his view. Equality is merely the means by which the state brings about the freedom of individuals. "Morality," says Michel, "ought to trail wellbeing like its shadow".

Henry Michel's thesis rests upon a metaphysical conception of social relations, in which moral autonomy is key. This metaphysical notion gives way to a comprehensive formulation of republicanism, which is not likely to be favorable to moral pluralism, given the fact that there is a primary good to be aimed at: moral autonomy. Consequently, Michel's contemporaries were reluctant to adopt his conception of social justice. Proclaiming the primacy of the right over the good, republican philosophers were keen to show the reason for which justice and equality are notions hostile to social homogeneity. They view justice and equality as the ultimate end of social evolution, visible at least since the end of feudalism and the caste system. Justice and equality are worthwhile objectives, yet they emerge retrospectively, as a result of the evolution of social history, rather than by way of introspective analysis, as a result of the moral essence of mankind which guides us toward justice and equality.

Spitz's work evolves into a fervent debate on social Darwinism at the close of the 19th century, and the decision to include Herbert Spencer's theses becomes clearer, as they become crucial to Spitz's account. Spencer conceived of society as a living organism, which natural evolution had decentralized. He saw any affirmation of state power as artificial and contrary to the natural course of evolution. Republican thinkers counter Spencer's thesis by claiming that the State's growth is the ultimate expression of natural social evolution even when it results in the individual's priority over the group. According to Alfred Fouillée (1836-1912), a critic of Spencer's views, the State must serve individuals' ends and shelter them from the arbitrary desires of the powerful as well as tyranny of the majority. He thought that, in the face of the success of industrialization, individuals must unite and form institutions that would be in line with this task. This is what differentiated the state of modern times from the governments of feudal times.

Amongst this assortment of republican thinkers, we find the founder of the social theory of solidarism, Leon Bourgeois (1851-1925). Spitz filters his own thought through Bourgeois' doctrine in order to produce an answer to contemporary political theorists that tend to underestimate the importance of moral and civic involvement in social justice. Social involvement can very well take place without relying upon either a strong conception of the good, or a set of religious or cultural values. Bourgeois' solidarism affirms the necessity of interdependence in order to attain individual independence. Thus, social evolution does not move from the individual to society, but the other way around. It is then to be expected that solidarity produces individuality. It would be absurd, under the pretense of defending individual rights, to view solidarity as the tyranny of the whole over its parts. Bourgeois constructs the idea of a quasi-contract, that is to say a minimal social contract, where the benefits of social cooperation generate obligations. The consent proper to this contract lies with the acceptance of the benefits which society secures for the individual. To benefit from such advantages is to consent to the benefit of the social order. Consent results from the contracting parties' appropriation of the contract, rather than through an explicit acceptance of its terms.

Two chapters are dedicated to Émile Durkheim (1858-1917), by far the most eminent scholar amongst those alluded to in Le moment républicain en France. The theory of social Darwinism and its republican critique are studied within the framework of nascent sociological theories. Chapter 5 illustrates Durkheim's contribution to the debate on social evolution as producer of individualism. Spitz explains the Durkheimian critique of economism, or the notion that social relations in modernity must be limited to minimal exchanges and must disappear the moment they cease to be useful. Spencer is presented anew as the adversary of republicans, alongside Tönnies. Although Durkheim viewed the role of society and the State as fundamental, he refused any form of communitarianism avant la lettre. Individual desires are no less demanding of social action despite the fact that the specific form of action remains to be determined. If modern society is defined by the supreme value which it accords to the individual, this must hold true of all individuals. Equality and the protection which it guarantees to individuals -- that they will be treated as though they each possess equal value in relation to all other members of the community -- is confirmed by social solidarity. Equality is then the natural ally of individualism. This entails that the State must launch a concerted effort in favor of equality. But what is the proper sense of equality being employed? Chapter 6 specifies one of the book's fundamental theses, according to which 19th century French republicanism upholds a conception of social justice as equality of opportunity. According to this thesis, modern societies naturally evolve when the appearance of inequalities between individuals artificially manifest themselves. What is implicit to social relations must become explicit by means of the Republic's work. The State is also not responsible for forging a social unity as artificial as the inequality which it would in so doing be endeavoring to remedy. A series of social measures that would favor social differentiation must then be recommended to the State, such as the division of labor, without simultaneously encouraging contrary behavior which would lead to dysfunction and inequalities. Again, the State must take seriously the idea that modernity is constituted by the affirmation of all individuals, without which modern individualism would be nothing other than a triumph of the weak over the strong -- a contingent power relation rather than a social phenomenon that may be observed ceteris paribus in modern times. Thus, social evolution demonstrates the fact that individualism is not contingent, but rather an inescapable and inseparable feature of modernity. Equality of opportunity, as the primary objective of a well-ordered republican society, must be integrated into the institutional mechanisms proper to democracies. The notion of a conciliating body is essential to egalitarianism, without which egalitarianism would simply become an abstract ideology whose institutionalization must be conceived of as an artificial power relation between the political community and the State.

Celestin Bouglé, whose work is now largely overlooked, is the crown jewel of Jean-Fabien Spitz's 'republican moment'. The two final chapters are devoted to Bouglé's political philosophy as well as to his refutation of social Darwinism. Like the aforementioned republican philosophers, Bouglé is convinced of the importance of putting social measures in place that favor the equal development of individuals. This implies abolishing the privileges linked to the inheritance of goods as well as the struggle against all form of privilege that is not associated with personal merit but rather with social class. Ultra-individualism is contrary to the normal development of modern societies since it leads to an absence of social norms and a power struggle whose ends are arbitrary. If individualism empirically assumes an actual separation between individuals, this separation cannot be translated into rights for lack of protection by the group. Quite the opposite: one must look to the State for protection rather than to the strength of each individual. Collective action and self-interest are only incompatible if the State is minimal, in which case it would no longer have the means of satisfying individual ends. If the State lacks the means or, more precisely, the power necessary to give citizens what they need, it will be forced to impose itself coercively, in which case it will give weight to the concern that the State presents itself as a barrier to individual liberty. If the State is legitimate this worry will be unfounded since all the State's power will stem from citizens' approval of its response to their individual demands.

The book as a whole is organized around a famous case in which individual liberty is defended: the Dreyfus affair. The Dreyfus affair questions the individual's ability to set his rights in opposition to the State, without all the while rupturing the social bond. Apart from two pages in one of the chapters on Durkheim, what is theoretically at stake in the Dreyfus affair is not made explicit in the book, which leads us to question whether Spitz's 'republican moment in France' is nothing but a historical reconstruction whose events have no real import. In fact, the actual event which allows us to speak of a republican moment in 19th century France, is the debate about social Darwinism to which the final chapter is dedicated. Social Darwinism claims that the natural struggle for survival is as visible within the social sciences as within the natural sciences. This is especially illustrated by the competition between members of a society. If this is the case, we ought to accept the power struggles which occur in the realm of law, which are normatively unjust yet factually coherent. Bouglé opposes the idea that the natural evolution of societies urges us to abandon power struggles little by little, in order to substitute them with the artificial bond which rights afford us. Far from distancing ourselves from one another to the point of losing each other, individuals form institutions that guarantee coexistence without homogeneity or devastating conflict. The reason that aristocracy disappeared is that it arbitrarily protected people without talent. The laws of evolution show that within a modern social context, privileges arbitrarily granted to individuals are unproductive and, rather than serving public interest, are only beneficial to a select few. Artificial measures are then necessary, but only those that adequately respond to the artificial situation in which the weak are under the yoke of the strong. The artifice of institutions permits us to reconnect with the normal course of events, and natural inequalities between individuals can finally compete under conditions that are stabilized by the equality of opportunity.

I highly recommend Jean-Fabien Spitz's work to all those interested in liberal and republican theories as well as to all those who find the link between the social sciences, the natural sciences, and political thought engaging. In light of my preceding remarks, one question remains which, although perhaps inconsequential, gives rise to doubt and deserves a response. Jean-Fabien Spitz, and others such as Philip Pettit, has sought to differentiate republicanism from the liberal tradition while avoiding the clearest means of differentiating themselves by refusing to adopt or identify their position with the positive conception of political liberty characteristically associated with republicanism. Pettit has evaded this dilemma by proposing a third alternative in his theory of freedom as non-domination. Although Spitz reembles Pettit on this point, his conviction is that this principle is best actualized institutionally when we privilege equal opportunity as the basis of social organization. We must then wonder whether the distinction between liberalism and republicanism is as relevant as some, such as Charles Larmore and Allan Patten, have long professed.

I believe this debate is faulty. If the radical distinction between republicanism and liberalism leads to a flawed interpretation of republican ideas, we are best to jettison it. But in conserving the term republicanism, we insist, in any case, on certain aspects of modern political thought that are analytically incompatible with anti-egalitarian theories such as those advocated by rightwing libertarians.